On Photography: A Philosophical Inquiry

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Diarmuid Costello, On Photography: A Philosophical Inquiry, Routledge, 2018, 165 pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415684491.

Reviewed by Paloma Atencia-Linares, Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México


Diarmuid Costello's new book bears the same title as Susan Sontag's published 40 years ago: On Photography. This is an intentional choice and a justified one, since the book surveys and does justice to a vast tradition and history of intellectual thought on photography from the early days (19th Century) until recent times. This is, in and of itself, a much needed contribution, given that the vast majority of books devoted to the philosophy of photography -- at least in the analytic tradition -- are either collections of essays, or idiosyncratic theories of photography that tend to omit (sometimes for justified reasons) a substantial part of the history of scholarly work on the subject. But, unlike Sontag's book, this is not an essay on cultural criticism of photography. Rather, as the subtitle indicates, this is a philosophical inquiry and, as such, provides thorough argumentation deeply informed by artistic practices.

There are three main issues where Costello's book puts the philosophical machinery to work. First, it reconstructs and helps readers understand a long-standing dialectic that lies at the heart of what has come to be the orthodox, or traditional thought about photography, i.e. a tension between sceptics and non-sceptics regarding the artistic possibilities of photography vis-à-vis the vindication of its special epistemic value. The book traces the roots of this orthodoxy and lucidly clarifies the subtleties of different approaches on both sides of the dialectic. Second, the book provides a critical assessment of this received view -- Costello both reviews well-known objections and provides new reasons of his own to be dissatisfied with it. Third, Costello tracks the development of a new philosophical paradigm that emerged as a reaction to the orthodoxy. He calls this the New Theory and explains how it developed in two stages: a restrictive, first version, and a more radical and recent one. Costello favors the more radical version, but he does so with some reservations. Although he does not advance a theory of his own, Costello gives the reader the argumentative and conceptual tools to draw her own conclusions.

Since its advent in the 19th Century, photography has struck theorists as a special kind of pictorial representation. Photography was conceived of as drastically different from previously existing pictures such as paintings, drawings and etchings, and its distinctive feature was explained in epistemic terms: photographs, unlike other pictures, were considered a privileged source of knowledge about the things they represent. This, in turn, was argued on the basis that photographs are mechanically produced, and thereby, bear a 'natural,' merely causal and counterfactual relation, independent of the beliefs of an agent, with the objects they depict. This emphasis on the epistemic advantages of photography, as well as the sharp distinction between photographs and other pictorial representations, was the trademark of what Costello calls the orthodox view. As Costello shows, this line of thinking was reflected, in one way or another, in the writings of theorists and practitioners from the 19th Century -- Eastlake, Emerson, Stieglitz, Evans and Demachy -- through modernism -- Weston, Adams, Strand, Benjamin and Kracauer -- and on to more contemporary writers from Stanley Cavell and André Bazin to Roger Scruton, Gregory Currie and Kendall Walton. Moreover, Costello makes it clear that, from the early years onwards, there has been a lingering tension in the orthodoxy between the epistemic conception of photography and the recognition of its artistic status. For the sceptics, or the more radical orthodoxy -- from Eastlake, N.P. Willis or T. O'Porter to Scruton or Robert Hopkins -- the purported mechanical nature of photography and its close connection to the real, imposes limitations on, or fully precludes, its artistic (and fictional) capacities. And even for some of the non-sceptics, such as Kracauer, if photographs can be art it is because they exploit what is a specific capacity of the medium, namely, realism.

This is the tradition against which the New Theory reacts. As Costello's description makes clear, the marks of this new wave of theorizing about photography are (i) the consideration of photography as a multi-stage process that crucially involves a recording of light onto a photosensitive surface (the photographic event), but is not exhausted by it, as the orthodoxy has it. Rather, it includes a series of anterior and ulterior processes that are integral to the production of the image (p.78). This complex process of production need not be automatic and belief-independent -- in fact, it is not even paradigmatically so. Moreover, it offers a wide range of possibilities for agential intervention. A consequence of this is that the New Theory (ii) rejects the sharp distinction between photographs and other pictorial representations with respect to their epistemic profile and artistic (and fictional) capacities; moreover, it (iii) vindicates and emphasizes the artistic while systematically playing down the epistemic side of photography.

This is especially the case for the radical version of the New Theory (NT-R) put forward by Dominic Lopes and described in detail by Costello. As Costello clearly explains, for the NT-R there is nothing epistemically advantageous that is intrinsic to photography or distinctive of it. Firstly, not all photographs are belief-independent-feature trackers -- a case that Costello nicely illustrates with the case of the photographic series Stem by Lee Friedlander (pp.117-121); secondly, there are hand-made non-photographic images that are belief-independent-feature trackers "including architects' blueprints and plans, archeological drawings and technical drawings of various kinds" (p.132). Finally, if photographs are widely regarded as epistemically privileged, this is only a psychological fact motivated by a set of practices governed by "knowledge-oriented norms" (p.133). While these photographic practices have been taken as the standard case of photography by the orthodoxy, there is no reason to believe that this is so. Photography, therefore -- or what a photograph is -- according to the New Theory, cannot be defined in epistemic terms.

Costello makes it clear that he is sympathetic, not only with the overall project of the New Theory, but specifically with the spirit of the NT-R. However, he expresses some reservations concerning the alternative definition of photography the NT-R offers, which is the following:

An item is a photograph if and only if it is an image that is a product of a photographic process, where a photographic process includes (1) a photographic event [the recording of a light image] as well as (2) processes for the production of images. (p.88)

In other words, according to the NT-R, inasmuch as a picture originates in the recording of a light image and involves other processes to produce an image, the picture is a photograph -- no matter the kind of ulterior processes involved or how they are performed.

Costello raises two objections against this definition. First, he claims that it generates a problem with the individuation of images, for there are photographs that are the product of more than one photographic event. So, in the case of, say, composite images, how do we know if we have one photograph or many? This, however, does not seem a fair criticism: from the fact that the photographic event is considered a necessary condition for an image to count as a photograph it does not follow that this must be the criterion for establishing what counts as a copy of the same photograph or whether a composite image in really one or various images. I agree with Costello that, given that the NT-R allows for composite or manually manipulated images to count as proper photographs, it would be interesting to have an account of how to individuate them. But this is a different issue from the task of distinguishing photographs from other pictorial kinds -- which is the purpose of the definition offered by the NT-R.

The second objection Costello raises, however, is indeed a genuine problem for the NT-R: if we strictly follow the proposed definition, we would need to count as photographs images that may look exactly like paintings, as long as they originate in a photographic event. Costello gives a hypothetical example of an image of the Kölner Dom where an artist uses a light image to trace the outlines of the figure but then proceeds to blur the likeness and apply fresh paint over it. The resulting image is "a largely monochromatic grey abstract with residual traces of other colours and some facture" (p.94). Costello objects that, according to the NT-R's definition, this picture should count as a photograph, but this is utterly counterintuitive. Notice that Costello's example is hypothetical, but there are many actual portraits and photo-realist paintings that are produced using photographs of sitters or scenes as their source -- i.e. they originate in a photographic event -- and yet, are uncontroversially considered paintings. The definition of photography offered by the NT-R would entail an unnecessary revision of our classificatory practices in these cases.

Moreover -- and this is a point that Costello does not raise -- the conception of photography that follows from the definition provided by the NT-R suggests that "works that are photographic may look like anything but" (p.145). Now, while one can imagine a photographer trying to make a statement and produce a photograph that does not look like one, this is typically not the case: the look of a photograph has always been considered a distinctive mark of the medium, and the basis of its characteristic perceived realism. This is a feature that any theory of photography should take into account even if one thinks, as is reasonable to do, that this phenomenology is not exclusive to photography. Yet, the NT-R completely disregards this issue: it not only gives a very revisionist conception of what counts as a photograph, it also provides no account of the phenomenology of photography. Here, one may argue, the orthodoxy presents an advantage over the New Theory, as there are a variety of views offered to explain this characteristic feature (Bazin's, Walton's or Hopkins', for example). Whether or not these accounts are satisfactory is another matter -- I, for one, think they are not -- but at least they provide substantive ideas on a feature of photography that is intuitively very relevant for the conception of the medium.

In the final chapter, Costello poses two test cases for the reader to consider which approach is preferable: the orthodox or the new. The first test case is digital photography. According to Costello, for New Theorists, "digital capture and processing seem unlikely to raise substantive issues" (p.142) -- digital sensors are just an alternative way to record light images, and new forms of image-manipulation are just different processes of producing images. By contrast, Costello argues that orthodox theorists are forced to claim that digital photography is radically different from its analogue counterpart, for otherwise, their conception of photography "as a mechanical or automatic mentation-free zone is in jeopardy." Now, one could question whether this analysis is completely fair to orthodox theorists. For while it is true that manipulation has become easier with digital technologies, it is also true that the process of production (although perhaps not post-postproduction) of digital photography has, arguably, been automatized even more and allows for a much more restricted control than the most traditional analogue photography. For example, while the process of converting a latent light image into a visible one was, or could be, in many instances, an artisanal action in analogue photography, in digital photography it is fully automatic and instantaneous. Moreover, digital technologies are in many instances much more precise in capturing information from scenes of the world than analogue ones -- one just needs to watch an episode of BBC's Planet Earth and compare it with any of Attenborough's older documentaries. So, the orthodox theorist can claim that, since neither automatism nor the reliability for tracking features are in jeopardy with digital technologies, nor is her comprehensive conception of photography. Of course, the problem with the orthodox view is that if distortive post-production turns out to be pervasive, many or perhaps most photographs would cease to be 'pure photographs' on their view. But while this is an implausible outcome, it is not inconsistent with what the theory says about analogue photography. Hence it is not clear that the orthodoxy is forced to postulate a difference in kind -- rather than a mere difference in degree -- between analogue and digital photography.

The second test case Costello gives is a paradigmatic instance of artistic photography, and one in which the photographer systematically intervenes in different stages of the photographic process: James Welling's work. In Aluminium Foil, Welling 'constructs the photographic scene from the ground up' (p.146). In Glass House, he disrupts 'the formation of the light image onto his camera's sensor' (p.147). In Flowers, he constructs images from scratch in the darkroom. According to Costello, much of what Welling does will not count as photography under the orthodox view; what he does would be considered, 'strictly speaking, either pre- or post-photographic' (p.146). On the New Theory, by contrast, 'the photographer can intervene, strictly photographically, in any of the stages that are necessary for the production of an image' (p.147). This last point, however, is not completely right. It is true that the New Theory conceives of photography as a multi-staged process. However, Lopes' radical version -- to which Costello is sympathetic -- is explicit in saying that, while all stages 'are essential to making a photograph  . . . Only the photographic event is intrinsically photographic.'[1] So, even when the NT-R seems more permissive than the orthodox view -- it considers Welling's action as integral to the practice of photography -- it is nevertheless almost as restrictive as the orthodoxy, since it considers many of the processes involved in Welling's actions as non-photographic. And this is so even when they involve the manipulation and control of the incidence of light onto the photosensitive material, provided that this manipulation or control is performed in stages different from the photographic event. This, I take it, is a weakness of the view, one that Costello overlooks.

All in all, although Costello might be guilty of being somehow partial to what is, to this date, the most robust version of the New Theory, this book provides a thorough and up-to-date analysis of the state of the art in the analytic philosophy of photography. It is important to bear in mind, though, that Costello's volume, unlike Sontag's, focuses on only one prominent issue in analytic philosophy of photography, namely, the relationship between the purported epistemic advantage of photography and its artistic potential. The book does not delve into other aspects of photographic images such as moral or political concerns. These themes, as well as a systematic new approach to the phenomenology of photography are arguably the New Theory's pending tasks. But as Costello shows, things are moving forward in philosophical theorizing on photography and, while the change has been slow, the prospects look promising.

[1] Dominic Lopes, Four Arts of Photography, Willey-Blackwell, 2016, 81.