On Psychoanalysis

Placeholder book cover

Paul Ricoeur, On Psychoanalysis, Jean-Louis Schlegel and Catherine Goldenstein (eds.), David Pellauer (tr.), Polity Press, 2012, 238pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745661247.

Reviewed by Eftichis Pirovolakis, University of Patras, Greece


This collection of Paul Ricoeur's essays on Freudian psychoanalysis is the first volume in a series which aims to make available some of his significant writings and lectures that are out of print, difficult to find or not well known. The series is published under the auspices of the Ricoeur Foundation in Paris, and its second volume has just been made available in English also by Polity Press under the title Hermeneutics (January 2013). This first volume brings together ten essays by Ricoeur along with an introduction by Jean-Louis Schlegel and a postface by Vinicio Busacchi. The editor's introduction is extremely helpful and philosophically accurate, but the postface appears hastily written and does not really do justice to the complexity and richness of Ricoeur's thinking. Busacchi insists, for instance, in an untenable way, on a sharp contrast between Ricoeur's views on psychoanalysis before and after 1965, when Freud and Philosophy: An Essay on Interpretation was originally published.

Ricoeur's essays, excellently translated by David Pellauer, one of his most faithful disciples, appeared between 1966 and 1988. As they were obviously prepared for different occasions, there is some overlap among them. Their order of arrangement is neither chronological nor strictly thematic. However, broadly speaking, one could identify three main thematic axes around which the essays revolve: psychoanalysis and truth, psychoanalysis and culture, and psychoanalysis and narrative. Ricoeur was arguably one of the few French philosophers who did not hesitate to take seriously into account Freud's early reflections. The texts collected here are illuminating and insightful for at least two reasons. First, they bear witness to Ricoeur's long-standing interest in Freud, who continued to influence his thought to his very last writings, namely, Memory, History, Forgetting (2004), and The Course of Recognition (2005). Reading On Psychoanalysis will provide anyone interested in Ricoeur's hermeneutics the chance to discern and even admire the continuity and remarkable coherence of his views on Freud over a period of about thirty years. Second, the texts simultaneously indicate the development of his philosophy by revealing new questions that preoccupied Ricoeur from the 1970s onwards and that shaped his thinking in the latter years of his life. Some of these thematic concerns had to do with language, text and narrative.

The first two texts, between which there is significant overlap, address the issue of the scientific status of Freudian psychoanalysis and its contentious relation to truth. They include Ricoeur's enlightening identification of four criteria according to which a 'psychoanalytic fact' can both be delimited and distinguished from other observable facts in the natural sciences: the intimate relation between a psychoanalytic fact and language or a certain meaningfulness, hence Ricoeur's insistence on the 'semantic dimension of desire' (13); the significance of transference and the intersubjective nature of the psychoanalytic situation; the coherence and resistance of psychical reality as opposed to material reality; and finally, the narrative character of psychoanalytic experience. Ricoeur's analyses of these criteria are invaluable because they reveal not only his meticulous and well-documented account of psychoanalysis but also a nuanced approach that takes the form of an intricate double gesture.

On the one hand, the linguistic, intersubjective, symbolic and narrative dimensions of psychoanalytic experience point to Ricoeur's misgivings about Freud's intention to construct a theoretical model in the positivist spirit of the natural sciences of his day. Some of Freud's texts are even said to envisage the future replacement of psychoanalysis by pharmacology. It is in this light that Ricoeur appeals to Jürgen Habermas's criticism of Freud's strictly energetic model and goes on to construe unconscious mechanisms and their 'desymbolized' or 'delinguisticized motives' as always amenable to 'resymbolization' thanks to psychoanalytic treatment (31). Ricoeur concedes that the psychoanalytic situation is organized by and oriented toward a self-reflexive and emancipatory telos that is intersubjectively pursued. However, he is reluctant to follow Habermas in his attempt to radically transform psychoanalysis into a critical social science. This is why, on the other hand, Ricoeur points out that one should never lose sight of Freud's ground-breaking discovery, namely, the economic model and the conviction that the psyche ultimately functions like a thing, which means that its uncanny operations cannot be exhaustively fathomed by a theoretical exegesis or a hermeneutics. Ricoeur's second gesture indicates the radicality of his own thinking inasmuch as he allows for the possibility, if not necessity, of a machine-like alterity at the very heart of the psychical system. The affirmation of this alterity does not debilitate the project of self-reflexion and self-recognition. Rather, by explicitly admitting the essential limitations on any pretence to a definitive and conclusive restitution of meaning, Ricoeur's discourse constitutes a cautious call for modesty and critical vigilance.

A similar complication of any hermeneutic temptation to reduce psychoanalysis to a merely exegetical enterprise is evident in the fourth essay, 'Image and Language in Psychoanalysis'. After a useful discussion of various endeavors to reformulate psychoanalytic theory in terms of a linguistic model, a discussion that includes a brief and perhaps slightly reductive account of Jacques Lacan's complex analogy between the unconscious and language or rhetoric, Ricoeur distinguishes the linguistic from the semiotic. The advantage of the semiotic dimension is that it both allows for the meaningfulness of psychical material (e.g., of the images to which the dream-work gives rise), and admits to the autonomy of what he designates 'a space of fantasy' (114). By adopting this term, which also refers to other manifestations of the life of make-believe such as folklore, myth, fiction and artworks, Ricoeur acknowledges the impossibility of a complete translation, without remainder, of unconscious imaginative expressions into the realm of language and discourse.

The third essay is strangely placed in between the three texts already discussed, although its thematic framework is not strictly epistemological. Ricoeur explores here the possibility of a constructive exchange between a psychoanalytic and a phenomenological approach in relation to the thorny issues of intersubjectivity and empathy. This is why he focuses not on Freud but on Heinz Kohut's metapsychology of the self and detailed account of empathy and transference. The philosophical conceptual paradigms of intersubjectivity examined are those of Hegel, Levinas and Husserl, where the latter is claimed to function as a transition point between the divergent views of the former two. Ricoeur points out the affinities between Kohut's three types of transference (mirror, idealizing and twin transference) and each of the three philosophical paradigms, while also acknowledging their incompatibilities. Given that this essay was first published in 1986, just a few years before 1990 when Oneself as Another was published, one can clearly see that Ricoeur's major preoccupation at the time was the question of selfhood and the corollary relation between self and other.

The next set of essays is concerned with the cultural import of psychoanalytic theory and its intrusion into the domains of morality, religion and aesthetics. With respect to its relevance to culture in general, 'Psychiatry and Moral Values' includes excellent analyses not only of why psychoanalysis constitutes a 'theory of the dialectic between desire and culture' (122), but also of the crucial gigantomachia between Eros and Thanatos (the life and death instincts). It also includes an excellent analysis of the second topography where the authoritarian superego holds aggressiveness in check by means of the feeling of guilt. As far as morality in concerned, Ricoeur identifies three interdependent levels of psychoanalytic explanation: the clinical description of morality, the genetic level of explanation, and the economic reformulation of the processes involved. Freud's approach to morality is said to be essentially economic insofar as it interprets culture in terms of its emotional cost in pleasure and pain. Ricoeur's characterization of Freud as one of the 'masters of suspicion' results partly from his critical stance apropos of the oppression and prohibitions of moral life. However, saying that psychoanalysis is incongruous with the moral prescription of duties is one thing, claiming that it is ethically irrelevant is quite another. To the extent that psychoanalysis is a therapeutic technique encouraging one to struggle against dissimulating resistances with a view to achieving an authentic self-awareness, it appeals to a certain value of veracity which, for Ricoeur, is ethical precisely because it is not moralistic.

In 'The Atheism of Freudian Psychoanalysis', Ricoeur initially differentiates Freud's critique of religion from the epistemological objections raised in the name of positivism. Next, he goes on to present the psychoanalytic construal in terms of the same three-level structure he adopted in his discussion of morality: clinical, genetic-historical and economic explanations are interwoven with one another, all converging to reveal a child-like nostalgia for the father as the underlying meaning of religion. The problem with such a critique is that it remains a largely interpretative gesture oriented toward or even enslaved by the past, a gesture obsessed with archaic sin, a neurotic sense of guilt and the concomitant set of prohibitions. Ricoeur concludes, nevertheless, on an optimistic note by announcing the possibility of a positive contribution by psychoanalysis to religion. In view of the latter's relation to consolation, psychoanalysis could be instrumental in helping one overcome the infantile consolation based on self-interest in order to achieve a genuine, future-oriented consolation that would result from the work of mourning and an extreme obedience to reality.

Two texts are devoted to the question of psychoanalysis and art: 'Psychoanalysis and the Work of Art' and the final essay of the volume, 'Postscript: Listening to Freud One Last Time'. The initial argument of the former text concerns the correlation between psychical facts (e.g., dreams and symptoms) and mythical or literary motifs presented in artworks. The exemplary case here, naturally, is the myth in Oedipus Rex, which lent the name of its hero to the personal complex that self-analysis revealed. Intimate psychical experience, maintains Ricoeur, despite its apparent particularity and incommunicability, contains structural invariants without which it could be neither identified nor named as such. Art makes the most of this structural aspect by elevating a personal experience to the level of a universalizable meaning encapsulated in a specific artistic form, in a tragedy or a poem. Furthermore, both artistic creations and the fantasies of the dreamer or even the neurotic, by virtue of belonging to the realm of Phantasieren, are determined by two distinctive features: figurability and substitution. Freud's 'The Moses of Michelangelo', for example, explicates the analogy between dream content and the marble statue of Moses. In both cases, psychoanalysis is confronted with an enigma it is called upon to decipher by using a similar technique. Ricoeur clarifies that the operations of figurability and substitution imply a certain notion of 'representation' or 'meaning' that is not naïve. After all, the unconscious mechanisms of displacement, condensation, primal repression and deferred action [Nachträglichkeit] have to be reckoned with here. In this respect, Freud's technical term 'psychical representative' is instrumental and also reminiscent of Ricoeur's comparable analyses in Freud and Philosophy.

It is in Leonardo da Vinci and a Memory of his Childhood that Freud concentrates on the enigma of artistic creation as such. Sublimation is proposed as the 'rarest and most perfect' mechanism whereby the libido is transformed into curiosity and a powerful instinct for research (181). Ricoeur contends that Freud's theory goes beyond the mere quasi-economic identification of an equivalence between Leonardo's fantasies and his artworks. It may still be the case that there is an analogy between his childhood memory and homosexual dreams, on the one hand, and the mysterious smile of the Mona Lisa, on the other. However, a simple interchangeability is out of the question. One can go from the work to the fantasy, but one cannot find the work in the fantasy. Although Ricoeur is aware of the limits of the psychoanalytic explanation of artistic creation, he is evidently intrigued by the dialectical force of sublimation, its capacity to overcome the meaning of fantasy in order to elevate it to a higher realm, 'the space of culture' (184). In 'Postscript: Listening to Freud One Last Time', by means of yet another teleological sleight of hand, Ricoeur subordinates the specificity of that cultural space to the superior demand for a rationalizing, 'active, personal resignation to necessity', an attitude closer to philosophical thought rather than art (218).

Of the two essays dealing with narrative, 'Life: A Story in Search of a Narrator' is only remotely related to psychoanalysis so its inclusion in the collection is hardly justified. The essay summarizes several analyses from the third volume of Time and Narrative in relation, for instance, to emplotment and traditionality, the narrative character of human life and experience, and the influential motif of narrative identity. This essay serves mainly as a transition point to the following text, 'Narrative: Its Place in Psychoanalysis', where Ricoeur declares his dissatisfaction with the discordance between Freud's theoretical, mechanistic model and psychoanalytic practice. The criteriology of the psychoanalytic fact is reiterated once again, culminating, it will be recalled, in the ineluctably narrative dimension of the psychoanalytic situation and the intersubjective process of treatment. Ricoeur differentiates the literary from the psychoanalytic narrative in light of the latter's essential open-endedness at both terms of human existence, our birth and our death. By accentuating the projective element of such an existential narrative, he is again voicing a reservation about Freud's archaeology of desire and the concomitant obsession with the past. Far from saying that Freud was oblivious to the futural dimension of psychoanalytic therapy, Ricoeur perhaps would have liked him to have taken a little more seriously the 'dialectic between expectation and memory' and its projective nature (210).

All essays collected in On Psychoanalysis bear witness to Ricoeur's determination cautiously to combine opposing standpoints in order to secure a more comprehensive and circumspect view over the topic under examination. In the 'Editor's Introduction', Schlegel admits to this "'Hegelian'" tendency which, in the case of psychoanalysis, might be accused of neutralizing the rupturing force of Freud's writings (8). Ricoeur's texts on culture and narrative favor categories and approaches whereby a certain priority is indeed granted to the synthetic, conciliatory and sublimating aspect of psychoanalysis, perhaps at the expense of its more disturbing findings and radical questioning of Western thought. Simultaneously, the first essays in this volume, despite also endorsing dialectical relations and a teleological perspective, appear to be more receptive to the idea that the elements of alterity psychoanalysis discovers at the centre of both conscious experience and culture are so radical that they should seriously complicate all positive possibilities of interpretation, recognition and reconciliation. Ricoeur's double gesture cannot be chronologically decided on the basis of the publication date of the essays. Perhaps, the philosophical value and finesse of his thinking results precisely from his ability to maintain both tendencies or demands at the same time. Whether this simultaneous affirmation of two apparently contradictory demands is philosophically compatible with some of his favorite terms, such as 'dialectic', 'selfhood', 'recognition', 'hermeneutics', etc., is a question which one has seriously to reflect upon, and to which one may be inclined to respond in various ways. In any case, on the evidence of the essays in this volume, Ricoeur should be given credit for being one of the very few professional French philosophers who dared engage with psychoanalysis in a responsible and challenging way, thereby ensuring for it a present and a future that would almost certainly be different had it not been for his sustained interest in and nuanced readings of Freud.