On Reference

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Andrea Bianchi, On Reference, Oxford University Press, 2015, 415 pp., £50.00, ISBN 978-0-19-871408-8.

Reviewed by Gregory Bochner, F.R.S.-FNRS, Université Libre de Bruxelles


This volume gathers a collection of eighteen new essays on reference by an international team of renowned researchers. Together the samples cover an impressive array of theoretical issues. Ranging from the philosophy of language and mind to linguistic semantics, they represent different vivid trends and topics within the contemporary debates about reference: eliminativism and use theories of meaning (Gauker, Marconi), experimental philosophy (Machery et al.), empirical vs. conceptual analyses of reference (Bianchi, Devitt, Capuano, Almog et al.), direct reference and speaker meaning (Martí, Devitt, Perry), empty names and representations (Reimer, Santambrogio), predicativism vs. referentialism (Napoli, Jeshion, Fara), attitude ascriptions (Pinillos, Santambrogio), semantic relationism (Pinillos), referential uses of descriptions (Cumming), evaluative adjectives and non-modal intensionality (Keenan).

This book is not an introduction to theories of reference. It is rather a contribution to our understanding of many substantial and methodological issues arising in the still open assessment of the scope and consequences of the referentialist revolution that occurred in the 1970s under the impetus of Saul Kripke, Keith Donnellan, David Kaplan, Hilary Putnam, Tyler Burge (all of whose views are discussed in the volume), Michael Devitt, John Perry, and Joseph Almog (who contribute to the present volume). It will be of great interest to researchers working on the many subtle challenges which reference puzzles continue to raise in a quest for a uniform and articulated theory of language, thought, and perception.

The essays are distributed in three parts: (I) The Nature of Reference, (II) Reference and Cognition, and (III) Reference and Semantics.

1. Christopher Gauker opens Part (I) with "The Illusion of Semantic Reference." How can we explain our "resilient" intuition that we know what our terms refer to on the assumption that there is no such thing as semantic reference? Gauker offers a skeptical account of what it is to know the meaning of a term -- (somewhat) reminiscent of the skeptical account of what it is know how to add that Kripke ascribed to Wittgenstein -- taking the form of an account of the social status we grant to a person in saying that she knows the meaning of 'X'. "In normal cases, where communication proceeds smoothly, we know how to respond to other people's words without thinking about meanings." Talk of meaning occurs in the context of "conversational repairs." When there is a doubt about interpretation, we resolve it by granting the speaker the social status of knowing the meanings of her words. As Gauker admits, even if we can assuage the "recalcitrant," the "hard work" is to dispense with reference altogether.

2. In his incisive contribution, "Reference and Theories of Meaning as Use," Diego Marconi argues that Horwich's use theory of meaning is incompatible with externalist accounts of meaning introduced by Putnam (1975) or Burge (1979). He shows that the tension concerns both social and natural externalism.

Thus according to natural externalism, meaning is sometimes determined by the physical nature of the things in the speaker's environment. Oscar's use of 'water' on Earth means water, the substance made up of H2O-molecules, even if he cannot discriminate H2O from a qualitatively indistinguishable substance on Twin-Earth, twater, which is made up of XYZ-molecules, based on their superficial properties. The difference between water and twater is cognitively inaccessible to Oscar; but a speaker's dispositions to use are based on her cognitive resources; so dispositions to use do not discriminate uses of 'water' for water and twater. Thereby, a use theory ends up predicting that Earthian and Twin-Earthian uses of 'water' are synonymous, even though they have different extensions.

To address this kind of worry, Horwich claims (a) that (trivially) meaning determines extension, but (b) that use does not determine extension, so that errors remain possible. Marconi convincingly argues that Horwich's deflationary theory of the relation between meaning and reference fails to defuse the tension with externalism.

3. In "Speaker's Reference and Cross-Cultural Semantics," Edouard Machery, Justin Sytsma, and Max Deutsch present five new empirical studies appearing to corroborate the main result of Machery et al. (2004): intuitions about reference would vary depending on the cultural background. In the famous Gödel-case devised by Kripke (1980) to undermine the description theory of proper names, Americans have the anti-descriptivist intuitions, but a majority of Chinese respondents would have descriptivist intuitions.

Using the Gödel-scenario, Machery et al. (2004) had asked:

"When John uses the name 'Gödel', is he talking about:

(A) the person who really discovered the incompleteness of arithmetic? or

(B) about the person who got hold of the manuscript and claimed credit for the work?"

These experiments had been criticized on the grounds that the questions were ambiguous with regard to the distinction between semantic reference and speaker's reference. In the five new studies, Machery et al. defuse this ambiguity by either (1) changing the vignette so that it asks specifically about the semantic reference; or (2) changing it so as to indicate that John intends talk about the person who got hold of the manuscript.

But I note that another important source of ambiguity is not acknowledged: the indexical adverb "really" in (A) could designate either the world considered as actual in the scenario or our actual world. If for some reason the Americans favored the former interpretation but the Chinese preferred the latter, this would be enough to explain the data. We would have no evidence against the Kripkean assumption that the relevant intuition is universal.

4. Genoveva Martí, in "Reference without Cognition," criticizes a recent "neo-cognitive" trend -- emerging in e.g. Kaplan (2012), Almog (2012; this volume), or Capuano (2012; this volume). This grants that sometimes linguistic reference is not mediated by a semantic rule determining a potentially new referent on each occasion of use, but maintains that reference is always mediated by a "cognitive fix" (in Wettstein's phrase): a non-descriptive way of "having the referent in mind." As against this, Martí uses variations on Kripke's (1977) Jones-Smith case to support a symmetrical claim: "Having the referent in mind is neither necessary nor sufficient for a use of a name to refer to it, much in the way that a backup of definite descriptions is neither necessary nor sufficient for a use of a name to reach its referent." A speaker who has A in mind may nonetheless end up talking about B, if she uses a name (conventionally) meaning B. So what one has "in mind" does not always determine what one refers to; conventions sometimes do that alone.

I think the parallel is indeed illuminating. In effect, I have argued (Bochner, 2014) with very similar examples that Kripkean arguments can be run with equal force against a theory holding that the reference of names is mediated by non-descriptive fixes in the mind of individual speakers.

5. In "Repetition and Reference," Andrea Bianchi makes some steps towards producing a full-blown theory of reference out of the picture sketched by Kripke (1980). Following Kripke, Bianchi thinks that a theory of reference requires not a conceptual, a priori analysis of the concept of reference -- this leads to circularity -- but a metaphysical, a posteriori investigation of a worldly relation. Bianchi formulates a desideratum: a theory of reference must not appeal to the intentional properties of mental states in a non-eliminable way.

The final theory Bianchi offers, (3), mentions two relations: repetition and introduction.

(3) ⱯxⱯy (x refers to y ↔ (x is introduced for y ∨ ∃z (x is a repetition of z ∧ z was introduced for y)))

His main thesis is that once a referential term has been introduced, reference-borrowings can be fully explained by repetitions. But unlike Kaplan (1990), Bianchi takes repetitions to be causal relations, "a matter of mechanics: parrots repeat, and repeating machines can be manufactured." On his view, it is only an accident if in humans repetition involves intentions or complex psychological and neurophysiological processes.

6. In "Should Proper Names Still Seem So Problematic?", Michael Devitt refines his early non-Millian theory (1974; 1981) according to which the meaning of a proper name is just its causal mode of referring. This respects two of his longstanding commitments: (i) an opposition to the Cartesian view regarding linguistic competence as implicit propositional knowledge, and (ii) a naturalistic approach to meaning and reference.

His account of reference involves "groundings" and "borrowings." In short: "Groundings fix designation. From the causal-perceptual account of groundings we get the likelihood of multiple groundings. From multiple groundings we get the possibility of confusion through misidentification. From confusion we get the possibility of designation change through change in the pattern of groundings."

Regarding meaning, a causal, "nondescriptive mode of reference" plays the semantic role of determining the reference and the cognitive role of explaining behavior by capturing the way a speaker thinks about the referent. Devitt thinks that this view has seemed "shocking" because of a Cartesian stance that regarded competence as a know-that rather than as a know-how. As Devitt admits, his (really: neo-Fregean?) view also has the (unwelcome) consequence that the standing meaning of a name changes from occurrence to occurrence.

7. Antonio Capuano, who opens Part (II) of the volume with "Thinking about an Individual," compares two different pictures of cognition.

The "inside-out" picture (inherited from Frege and Russell) sees cognition as moving from mind-to-world, via intermediate representations in the mind. "In some sense, whether there really is or there is not an object I am thinking about does not make much difference to my cognitive state." This picture, Capuano says, is at stake in most accounts of what it is to think about an individual. (It looks a lot like the picture locating the "seeds" of reference "in" the mind, which Ruth Millikan has long attacked.)

Capuano defends an opposite view (traced to Kripke and Donnellan). The "outside-in" picture sees cognition as moving from world-to-mind, via natural processes bringing objects into the mind. "Cognition is the result of thinkers receiving, by way of natural processes, incoming signals from objects about which later they come to know truths."

Capuano insists that the outside-in picture makes a more fundamental claim than externalism or anti-individualism. Thus he argues that Burge's account is anti-individualistic but inside-out, as what is in the mind is supposed to be a representation, and as we begin with the representation, and try to reach an object from it. (NB: The outside-in view is more radical than the "neo-cognition" view above: it denies that any cognitive fix in the mind is the seed of reference.)

One may wonder: does the outside-in picture, which suggests that an object rather than a representation literally enters into the mind, entail an "extended mind" hypothesis?

8. Marga Reimer, in "Drawing, Seeing, Referring: Reflections on Macbeth's Dagger," observes that "drawing an X" is ambiguous. On an ontic reading, the drawing essentially involves a model, an actual X which the artist intends to portray. "The drawing is of that particular X and is derivative." On a non-ontic reading, it involves no model; it is creative. Despite this difference, derivative and creative drawings may be qualitatively indistinguishable.

Concerning Macbeth's dagger, Reimer notes that "seeing an X" exhibits the same ambiguity between derivative (veridical) and creative (non-veridical, as in hallucination) interpretations. She then argues that the ontic/non-ontic distinction extends to "referring to an X."

Reimer anticipates an objection: in drawing, a material artifact is created, whereas in seeing or referring do physical thing is created. Hence she invokes unwitting creation of mythical artifacts in the wake of Salmon (1998): "when the hallucinating Macbeth mistakes his experience as of a dagger for an experience of a dagger -- whether real or unreal -- he effectively creates an abstract object, akin to a fictional character." Once this is created, Macbeth can talk about, think about, and reason about the "hypostatized dagger."

9. In "The Cognitive Contribution of Names," John Perry argues that the "direct" cognitive contribution of a name, i.e. the cognitive value determined by semantics alone, is only "how it sounds" or "how it looks." An identity statement like 'San Sebastian is Donostia' is not about names, yet a hearer interpreting it "will be led to have beliefs, or at least to acquire know-how, about names and sounds as part of the process of recognizing the sentence and parsing it." Co-referential names often involve different perceptions, cognitions, skills, and rules, constituting distinct pieces of (linguistic, implicit, procedural) knowledge. (Perry relates his view to Frege's in the Begriffsschrift: the content of a name is an individual, but its cognitive value depends on the link between its form and its content.) But all other cognitive effects of names pertains to pragmatics, which "deals with causes and effects, productions of tokens of types, by speakers with certain motives, and apprehensions of them by hearers, with immediate cognitive effects."

10. Part (III) of the volume begins with "Names as Predicates?" Ernesto Napoli criticizes the view that proper names are predicates. Some uses of names seem "argumental" ('Mary is a writer'), whereas others seem "predicative" ('The Mary I met yesterday is a writer'). Napoli analyses the predicativist view as a conjunction of two theses: (1) apparently predicative uses are really predicative, (2) apparently argumental uses are not really argumental.

What is a name? Napoli argues that the only plausible criterion compatible with predicativism is this: a name is an expression arbitrarily imposed on an individual via a stipulation (baptism) in which the name is "used quotationally," i.e. not as a name of an individual. In successive (non-quotational) uses, the name means the property of being a bearer of the expression.

This view promises a unified account, but Napoli argues that it faces two problems. First, it works only if a stipulation is necessary and sufficient for making an expression into a name. Second, "even if we are willing to grant that an individual acquires the property of being a bearer of 'N' by having 'N' imposed on her by stipulation, we should agree that to impose 'N' on a certain individual by an explicit stipulation is not therefore to impose 'N' on the property of being a bearer of 'N'."

11. The "Uniformity Argument" for predicativism is the central target of "Names Not Predicates," by Robin Jeshion. Inspired by Burge (1973), Fara (2011; forthcoming) defends a theory of proper names encompassing the "Being Called Condition" ("BCC"): "A proper name 'N' is a predicate that is true of a thing if and only if it is called N." The (supposedly decisive) argument in favor of predicativism over referentialism lies in its purported capacity to provide a unified account of both predicative and referential uses. A referential use like 'Alfred studies in Princeton' is analysed as a predicative use in disguise, amounting to either 'That Alfred studies in Princeton' (Burge) or 'The Alfred studies in Princeton' (Fara 2011). (Both options raise serious difficulties, but Jeshion sets them aside.)

Jeshion argues that the BCC condition is limited in scope: it does not supply the correct truth-conditions for a wide variety of uses that are not more contrived or metaphorical than the ones favored by predicativists. These include 'Joe Romanov [my barber] is not a Romanov' (which is intuitively true but should be false by the lights of BCC); 'You are definitely a Jeshion' (said to Jeshion while she exhibits flashes of anxiety that are characteristic of her family members) (which is true but not because she is named 'Jeshion'); or 'Two Stellas are inside the museum' to designate objects (paintings) which were produced by a certain individual (the painter) but which are not named 'Stella'.

12. In her response "'Literal' Uses of Proper Names," Delia G. Fara attributes to Jeshion an "anti-unification argument": (P1) Predicativists think that all literal uses of proper names conform to BCC; (P2) A use of a proper name is either literal or metaphorical ("Burge's claim"); (P3) There are nonmetaphorical uses that do not satisfy BCC; (C1) Therefore, some literal uses of predicative proper names do not satisfy BCC; (C2) Therefore, predicativists are wrong: there is no unified analysis of literal uses of predicative proper names; (P4) Predicativists have justification for giving a unified analysis of predicative and referential uses only if they provide a uniform analysis of all literal uses of predicative proper names. (C5) Therefore, predicativists lack this justification.

Fara refuses (P2), and re-classifies most of the alleged counterexamples to (P3) as nonmetaphorical and non-literal. She argues that if these were real counterexamples to BCC, they should equally affect the (uncontroversial) meaning analysis of count nouns.

Only one class of examples seems to her potentially problematic: the "Romanov examples." These do not conform to BCC, yet they seem to involve literal uses. Fara responds that these involve not proper names, but "proper nouns," which are "roughly, those nouns that require capitalization." To demarcate proper names and proper nouns, she offers a test (which she does not regard as question-begging): if 'Romanov' occurs as a proper name, it satisfies BCC.

13. Jeshion replies in "A Rejoinder to Fara's "'Literal' Uses of Proper Names" that she was not advancing any kind of anti-Uniformity Argument against predicativism. "The argument that I do present is that the predicativist's own Uniformity Argument on behalf of predicativism, as a superior theory to referentialism, does not hold up." Her conclusion was that by virtue of this argument, the predicativist does not have an advantage over the referentialist.

Jeshion did not embrace Burge's claim; she refuses it. More fundamentally, her argument is that predicativism cannot cordon off the relevant uses -- whether they are literal or metaphorical or otherwise -- as obviously different in kind from their favorite predicative ones. The issue was the justification for taking these examples as the canonical examples of predicative uses, the ones illustrating the normal application conditions of proper names. The challenge for the predicativist is to demonstrate that the "BCC-friendly" uses are syntactically or semantically different in kind from the other predicative uses which Jeshion offered.

The debate looks somewhat contrived to me. Fara did officially reconstrue the argument in terms of justification, in (P4) and (C5). At the same time, Jeshion does have a general point when she claims that the predicativist criteria to identify the literal uses seem arbitrary.

14. In "Empty Names, Propositions, and Attitude Ascriptions," Marco Santambrogio sketches a new theory of empty names. This involves "new-style," "language-bound," and "structured" propositions. The "expressive value" that a name contributes to such a proposition is not a referent. Sameness of reference identifies an equivalence class on the domain of names, in any language or in some particular language, and this determines the language-bound propositions: "Suppose that, in English, the only names referring to the greatest Roman orator are 'Cicero', 'Tully', and 'Marcus', so that the sentence 'Cicero is bald' expresses, in English, the new-style proposition that can be represented as <{'Cicero', 'Tully', 'Marcus'}, {'being bald'}> -- assuming, for simplicity, that 'being bald' is the only predicate available in English to refer to the property of baldness." Now an English sentence containing an empty name 'Vulcan is a planet' will express a proposition representable as <{'Vulcan'}, {'being a planet'}>, where "the name 'Vulcan', which was assumed to be empty, does not refer to the first component of that proposition. Expressive value and reference have split."

The truth-conditions for these new-style propositions will be quite different from those of singular or descriptive propositions. On a conservative option, the proposition <{'Cicero', 'Tully', 'Marcus'}, {'being bald'}> is true if and only if "all the names in the set forming the first component have one, and only one, referent and the latter exemplifies the property that is the referent of the predicate in the second component."

I think that this account creates further difficulties, however. The view implies that all co-referential names of a language have the same meaning. So it does not solve Frege's puzzle. That is fine, but the problem is that it is difficult to see how it could be augmented to solve it.

15. Angel Pinillos tackles a version of Frege's puzzle in "Millianism, Relationism, and Attitude Ascriptions." Millians predict that (1) and (2) mean the same and have the same truth value:

(1) Lois Lane believes that Superman is Superman.

(2) Lois Lane believes that Superman is Clark Kent.

Yet intuitively these ascriptions say different things, as Lois Lane thinks of the same person in two different ways. Fine's (2007) relationism afforded a new kind of solution: (1) is trivial because the occurrences 'Superman' and 'Superman' are coordinated; (2) is informative because the occurrences 'Superman' and 'Clark Kent' are not coordinated. As coordination is a semantic relation affecting content, different propositions are expressed.

Relationism covers only pairs of expressions, hence it cannot account for ascriptions involving a single occurrence, like:

(3) Lois Lane believes that Clark Kent can fly.

Hence Fine argued that discourse is the relevant unit. Soames (2010), however, advanced an "intra-discourse coordination is not enough" (IDCNE) objection: there are discourses where sentences like (3) are intuitively not true, yet no other statement is asserted or presupposed. In response, Fine (2010) introduced inter-discourse coordination.

Here Pinillos argues that the IDCNE is unsuccessful, so that inter-discourse coordination is not needed: intra-discourse coordination is enough to solve Frege's puzzle. According to Pinillos, de dicto uses of sentences like (3) are always implicitly accompanied by other mental state ascriptions. Soames (2002) accounted for the falsity of (3) by invoking "descriptively enriched propositions," where the enrichments were only pragmatically conveyed by the speech act. Borrowing this strategy, Pinillos argues that the discourse includes what is semantically expressed as accompanied by the presupposed descriptive contents.

16. Samuel Cumming observes in "The Dilemma of Indefinites" that there is empirical evidence for both a referential analysis (2a) and an existential analysis (2b):

(2a) 'An F is G' has an object-containing semantic content.

(2b) 'An F is G' does not have an object-dependent truth-condition.

To maintain (2a) and (2b), Cumming argues, we must give up (1):

(1) The truth-value of an utterance is jointly determined by its semantic content and its proper circumstance of evaluation.

Then, an utterance can "have both a singular content and an existential truth condition."

Evidence for (2a) includes (4):

(4) A woman named 'Julia Gillard' is prime minister of Australia.

Cumming claims that although this sentence has existential truth conditions, its utterance transmits to the audience an ability to refer to a particular woman, Julia Gillard. The hearer acquires a belief about her. So what is added to the common ground is a singular content.

Evidence for (2b) includes (7):

(7) A woman came to my office today.

In saying this, I typically "commit" to having a person "in mind." My utterance transmits, say, a singular proposition about a salesperson. Yet it "can be true without the proposition holding at the relevant circumstance of evaluation -- without the salesperson having in fact visited my office." As (2b) predicts, then, the utterance is true no matter which woman visited.

Cumming submits that the difference between definites and indefinites comes from a difference in the linguistic rule or instruction used by the hearer to interpret them. Definites are devices of coordination, instructing the hearer to select a matching interpretation among object-level mental files. Indefinites do not require to coordinate with the hearer on an old mental file, but to begin a new one. Coordination requires speakers to publicize their commitment to a particular mental file. Indefinites are devices for passing on reference without coordination, thereby establishing conventions, and operating without publicity. Definites and indefinites yield different truth conditions "once we accept that the truth condition of an utterance is a species of public commitment."

17. In "A Unified Treatment of (Pro-)Nominals in Ordinary English." Joseph Almog, Paul Nichols, and Jessica Pepp seek "a unified theory of nominals -- nouns, noun phrases, and pronouns -- as they appear in ordinary English." "For us, there is no invisible level of logical form, with a split trinity of "deictic" vs. "anaphoric" vs. "bound" (logically separate) words "he"; there is just the one and only visible English "he" and it is always referential."

In their opinion, the "formalist program" presupposing that there is no important theoretical difference between formal and natural languages remains caught in an internalist approach to natural languages which is at odds with the deepest lessons of the referentialist-externalist revolution emphasizing the role of causal-historical factors in the generation and interpretation of linguistic meanings. Abstracting from the natural history of words, the "derivability project" underlying the formalist program is to "derive the meanings of single words from internal meanings we already have in the head." "All single words of English are not at all like un-interpreted "immaculate" symbols of a formal language, symbols yet to be determined (in a model) with de novo semantic value. Our natural-historical words, like our perceptions, are already determined -- and loaded with their semantic currency -- by the time we use them." Against the "in vitro" ahistorical view of natural language with abstract logical forms, they defend an "in situ" semantics dealing with essentially historical facts.

They reject the external/internal divide for pronouns, using perceptual observations (of the surface form of words and sentences) and uniformity norms (a unified treatment of all uses of pronouns should be preferred). "On our view, the contribution of a pronoun to the semantics of a complete utterance is never determined by the application of a semantic rule. For us, pronouns refer in virtue of causal-historical connections, and pronoun interpretation is a posteriori." The difference between anaphoric and deictic pronouns is neither syntactic nor semantic. "Rather, it is a distinction between different aspects of a communicative situation -- aspects of the situation that make the use of a pronoun appropriate, and that the audience uses to identify a pronoun's referent."

This very rich and original contribution condenses many ideas surfacing elsewhere in the volume. Like Bianchi, Capuano, or Devitt, Almog et al. propose to regard reference as a natural relation to be investigated empirically. Assuming the essentiality of origins for uses, theoretical claims such as "This use of 'Aristotle' refers to Aristotle" will be necessary and a posteriori, in stark contrast with the formalist idea that "as long as the language in which one theorizes (the metalanguage) contains the language about which one theorizes (the object language), a claim of the form "'X' refers to X" is a priori and contingent."

18. The final chapter by Edward Keenan, "Individuals Explained Away," defends a formalist approach to natural language semantics. Keenan identifies two semantic properties of evaluative adjectives like 'skillful'. First, a sentence 'John is a skillfull surgeon' ('Kim is a talented flautist') entails 'John is a surgeon' ('Kim is a flautist'). Common noun phrases are interpreted in each model (context) c by properties p of individuals. Ext(p), the extension of p (in c), is the set of individuals which have p. Then evaluative adjectives are interpreted by extensionally restricting functions F from properties to properties: for all properties p, ext(F(p)) ⊆ ext(p). Hence: ext(skillful(surgeon)) ⊆ ext(surgeon). Second, evaluative adjectives are non-extensional: "If the heart surgeons and the portrait painters happen to be the same individuals in some context, the skillful heart surgeons and the skillful portrait painters may still be different individuals." So "for p,q agentive common noun phrases interpretations and F an evaluative adjective interpretation, it may happen that ext(p) = ext(q) but ext(F(p)) ≠ ext(F(q))."

Keenan claims that this phenonemon highlights a new type of intensionality: extensionality principles fail, yet "no cross model comparisons are suggested by this judgment," which would indicate that "the appeal of a possible world approach to non-extensionality is absent." He then proposes to generalize standard extensional model theory "without adding novel entities such as possible worlds or propositions."

Keenan replaces the universe of objects in our naïve ontology by a universe of atomic properties P now playing the roles that objects played in classical semantics. The non-extensionality of evaluative adjectives is then represented in such models of type P. This, as he says, eliminates the individuals which direct reference theories take to be the denotations of singular terms, unbound pronouns, and individual variables in logic.

Keenan claims to find empirical support for this move: that "cross-linguistically proper names are often (always?) historically derived from property-denoting expressions." But this, I think, could hardly be a justification. The fact that descriptive expressions can become proper names by "growing capitals" (as Barcan Marcus says) could be a metasemantic fact; indeed even the most Millian of us, Mill, granted this fact for the name 'Dartmouth'.


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