On Religious Diversity

Placeholder book cover

Robert McKim, On Religious Diversity, Oxford University Press, 2012, 172pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199774036.

Reviewed by Roger Trigg, St Cross College, University of Oxford


This is Robert McKim's second book on religious diversity. His first, Religious Ambiguity and Religious Diversity (Oxford, 2001), ended by concluding that 'God's hiddenness' creates uncertainty and an intrinsic ambiguity, which can only lead to religious belief being held tentatively. Dissent and doubt ought to be more of a central feature of any religious commitment. Martyrs dying for their faith were misled. Merely summarising the position shows how controversial it is, and how crucial for understanding the nature of religion any response to religious disagreement is.

In this book, there are echoes of his previous position, and McKim still argues for what he sees as 'religious ambiguity'. Indeed, he says towards the end that 'a recognition of ambiguity can help to liberate us from the feeling that there is something wrong with those who do not see things as we see them'. (158) The fact of religious diversity, therefore, should incline us to be more open to other traditions. McKim does acknowledge, however, that while seeing deep ambiguity, people of different traditions may still consistently retain the hope that 'if somehow all of the relevant evidence were to be taken into account, some of the central tenets of their tradition would be preserved relatively intact'. (159) He adds, though that they may have to be modified.

The relevance of religious disagreement at the most fundamental level to understandings about the truth of a particular religion is clear. It is perfectly possible to maintain that one's own tradition is right and all others wrong. No doubt others will think the same about their own tradition. This simple claim to truth, excluding others, has been dubbed 'exclusivism'. A modified version, 'inclusivism', accepts that other religions may have their own valuable insights. As McKim points out, an exclusivist cannot even accept that other religions have their own truths even if they in no way conflict with what the exclusivist believes. Even so, they will be still judged by the standards the inclusivist brings to bear. Karl Rahner's famous notion of 'anonymous Christians' is an example of this kind of thinking. As McKim puts it, this means outsiders can be insiders 'without knowing that this is so.' (78)

The third way of categorizing approaches to the variety of religious belief is the 'pluralist' approach. John Hick in many ways exemplifies this, and McKim makes a very interesting and a careful analysis of Hick's approach. One problem is that Hick follows Kantian ways of thinking in seeing the ultimate reality as a noumenon, existing in itself, but intrinsically unknowable and inaccessible. Describing 'it' as a personal loving God is already to make the reality too specific to some religious traditions. Instead Hick wants to see it as simply the 'Real'. The minute we conceptualize 'it', we speak from a particular tradition, and beg the question as to which tradition is right. McKim skilfully shows that Hick is not entirely consistent in his views and that they can be interpreted differently. The well-known example of the elephant being felt by blind men, as an example of different religions confronting truth, illustrates the problem. Each feels a different part of the animal, but in a sense they are each discovering something of the same reality. That is different from the idea that the Real is totally unknowable. As McKim comments, the elephant example can accommodate the possibility of learning more from others, 'rather than thinking, as the noumenal approach proposes, in terms of a reality about which, as it is in itself, we can know nothing or next to nothing'. (120) Indeed, on the noumenal approach it is far from clear what the relation of the Real to religious beliefs is. Does it merely have a causal influence on belief? Is it a posit to explain belief? Certainly its own nature cannot by definition appear reflected in any beliefs.

One major problem about evacuating the 'Real' of any substantive meaning is that it cannot even be considered good in itself. That would be a projection onto it of our own religious tradition, but it is a view that goes against Hick's own view that religious realism (the belief in an objective and transcendent divine reality) is an antidote to cosmic pessimism. Hick believed that Reality was good and concentrated his attention on major religions with a strong moral emphasis. Yet that kind of selection of religions is an illegitimate move for the true pluralist who should accept all religions as of equal value.

A major problem with pluralism is that if it sweepingly maintains that all religions are of equal value, it has to confront the issue that many, if not all, contradict each other. McKim says that the pluralist 'is committed to the view that anyone who denies pluralism is mistaken.' (107) That itself sounds a rather exclusivist position, and indeed it has been one of the points made in favour of the idea of exclusivism that the assertion of any truth, even the claim that there is no truth, excludes those who would contradict it. We cannot escape being exclusive at some level. Using language commits one to excluding some possibilities in favour of others. If I say it is raining, I exclude the possibility that it is not, and imply that those who believe that it is not are plain wrong. Believing means excluding alternatives. McKim, though, elucidates the pluralist claim about religion as holding that various views that seem inconsistent actually are consistent. Indeed, they are all true. That seems a bold and surprising claim for the pluralist to make. It is far from clear that John Hick's own pluralism can support such a view. He seems to be implying that, when confronted with noumenal reality, religions are all inadequate, the product of particular traditions rather than the fruit of a correspondence with the way things are. That, though, surely does not mean that religions (or a careful selection of them) are all equally true, but that they are all equally false.

One issue that McKim does not pursue is that pluralism can lead to relativism. Indeed, this is a common response to the mere fact of religious diversity. When faced with many conflicting claims, one answer may be that they are all wrong. Another, perhaps more tolerant one, might be to say that each is true 'for itself'. It can only be judged by its own criteria. How coherent such a view is may be another matter. It appears to be making a global claim about the character of religious truth, even if it relativizes it to particular sets of believers. It is not so very different as proclaiming that 'it is true that there is no such thing as truth'. Relativism seems the politically correct option in that it respects diversity, instead of challenging it. It seems a safe option for those who nowadays want simply to 'celebrate' diversity. Yet in so far as believers consider that they are claiming truth, an acceptance of relativism by those committed to a particular religion seems bound to undermine their own commitment, and their willingness to claim any truth at all.

McKim does not venture into the way in which pluralism can degenerate into relativism. The book has a deliberately narrow focus, hardly surprising given his previous book. The great strength of his new book is the way in which he does not follow those who so glibly use labels like 'exclusivism', inclusivism', and 'pluralism' without spelling out what is really meant. His careful analysis of the subtly different claims that can be made under these labels is very helpful, and, indeed, is his main subject. For example, he considers twelve different theses about exclusivism with regard to truth. Another stress is the important distinction between exclusivism (and inclusivism) about truth, and parallel theses concerning salvation. I could, for example, hold that Christianity alone is true, but still reckon that it is not within my understanding to decide whether only Christians can be 'saved'. McKim in his final chapter discusses the view that 'we [should] withhold judgment on the entire matter of the salvation of outsiders.' (161) Certainly there is no contradiction in claiming truth but reckoning that it is not my role, or that of any church, to be put in the place of God and make judgments about others.

Religious diversity is a major problem for those wanting to claim truth for a particular religion. When there is so much disagreement, and apparently no way of settling the arguments, what should our response be? McKim begins by claiming that 'there is no escaping the fact that the presence of competing traditions now confronts each of the traditions in a new and more forceful way'. (4) It is not to decry the importance of contemporary religious disagreement to note that the existence of many competing religions is not a new phenomenon. It would hardly have been news to St. Paul in Athens. Yet religion of some kind is a universal phenomenon. McKim points out 'that there never has been a culture without its own religion.' (5) There may be reasons for this, not least the fact, recently emphasised by the new discipline of the cognitive science of religion, that cognitive dispositions giving rise to religion are deeply rooted in human nature. They underdetermine the nature of the religion adopted, and that is why religious diversity is a fact of life. Even so, religion itself is always likely to be around in some form, and a book devoted to the various epistemological approaches to religious diversity is to be welcomed. It may not answer many questions, but it helps us think more clearly about the issues.