On Romantic Love: Simple Truths about a Complex Emotion

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Berit Brogaard, On Romantic Love: Simple Truths about a Complex Emotion, Oxford University Press, 2015, 270pp., $21.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199370733.

Reviewed by Hichem Naar, University of Montreal


This book is an attempt to offer a comprehensive picture of romantic love: what it is, what it involves, and how it is connected to other things. Berit Brogaard argues that romantic love, just like fear, anger, and sadness, is an emotion, and as a result can, like all emotions, be assessed for rationality. Furthermore, just as other emotions, romantic love can take various forms; it can, for instance, be unconscious. Finally, when romantic love is or has become irrational -- i.e., when one has good reasons to stop loving someone else -- there are ways to get rid of it, just like there are ways to get rid of our recalcitrant fears.

Informed by scientific research, Brogaard's project is rather ambitious, involving a theory of emotion and an argument to the effect that love is an emotion, a conception of the rationality of emotions, and a description of the ways one can fall out of love. On top of all this, Brogaard offers discussions of the neurophysiological underpinnings of romantic love, the relationship between romantic love and sex, and the relationship between romantic love and happiness. This is certainly a lot for such a small book, and all of the areas discussed and points made cannot be summarized easily. I will discuss what I take to be the book's most theoretically interesting and controversial ideas: its claims that love is an emotion and that emotions are appearances of the body and mind responding to the world, and its theory of the rationality of love.

Consider, first, Brogaard's broad conception of romantic love. According to her, romantic love is not a union between people, nor a concern for someone else, nor an unfelt drive which motivates behavior, but an emotion, something we typically feel (39-42). Against the union view, she argues, quite sensibly, that if love were a union between people, then unreciprocated love and love for a deceased person would be impossible, which is absurd. To the union theorist who insists that what matters for romantic love is the desire to form a union, and not a union per se, she responds that one can love someone without desiring to form a relationship with that person. Against the view identifying love with a concern, she argues that it is possible for one to have a deep concern for another without loving him. (For reasons of space, I'll leave aside Brogaard's treatment of the view that love is a drive.)

These arguments may seem too underdeveloped to be deemed acceptable, however. We might wonder, for instance, precisely why desiring to form a relationship with a person is not essential to romantic love. Furthermore, Brogaard's reason to reject the concern view can be resisted, for we might simply respond that romantic love is a specific kind of concern. On the concern view, love is not a generic kind of concern but a concern of a special kind. The challenge for the advocate of this position is to say what's special about love, what makes love a concern of a distinctive sort. In fact, Brogaard herself has a similar challenge with her theory of love as emotion. She has to show how love differs from other emotions. So, given that merely pointing to the fact that you can experience an emotion without being in love would not be an acceptable move against her theory, I don't see why it would an acceptable move against the concern view. In addition, a general worry we might have with Brogaard's conception of love as a regular emotion is that she might be not so much talking about the state of being in love as she is talking about the process of falling in love. Perhaps, indeed, something like a concern view (or some other views she does not discuss) is true of being in love, while Brogaard's account is true of the process of falling in love. A discussion of this distinction certainly would have been welcome.

Given that the rest of the book depends on the claim that love is an emotion, it is a shame that Brogaard does not spend more time arguing for it, no matter how plausible it is pre-theoretically.

Suppose that Brogaard is right in claiming that love is an emotion. What is an emotion, according to her? Brogaard starts her discussion by what she takes to be the "now classical" theory of emotion (46) put forward by William James at the end of the 19th century. According to James, emotions are perceptions of bodily changes. In having an emotion (e.g., sadness), you feel your body as being a certain way. James' theory, Brogaard is quick to point out, does not claim that an emotion is a bodily change or condition and so does not fall prey to worries stemming from cases where you undergo the relevant bodily changes without experiencing or feeling them. On James' account, you must have the bodily change and the feeling of the bodily change. Brogaard argues, quite convincingly, that James' theory is both too strong and incomplete. It is too strong in requiring the presence of actual bodily changes for an emotion to occur. Just as there are perceptual illusions of the environment (e.g., the stick in water appearing as bent), empirical studies suggest that 'bodily illusions' -- misperceptions of the body as being a certain way -- constitute a genuine phenomenon (55). As a result, if a view of emotions in the Jamesian tradition is to be successful, it should not claim that actual bodily changes are necessary for emotion. James' theory is incomplete in failing to do justice to the thought that emotions are directed at the external world. It seems that, perhaps in addition to being about the body, emotions must also be about the world outside the body, the things we fear, admire, and love.

This leads Brogaard to consider the 'two-factor' theory of emotions, developed by psychologists Stanley Schachter and Jerome E. Singer in the 1960s. According to it, an emotion consists of "both the experience of the physical arousal and our interpretation of the bodily experience relative to our situation." (63) On this view, which emotion we are experiencing depends in part on how we interpret the situation we are in. If we interpret our situation as involving danger, for instance, our agitation will constitute an instance of fear rather than excitement.

The two-factor theory, although better than James' theory in preserving the position that emotions are in some way about the world, has been found inadequate for various reasons. One reason Brogaard gives is what she calls the 'connection problem' (65). Suppose that you are in an agitated state characteristic of fear and that there are two animals in the room, a wild dog and a snake, both of which you take to be dangerous. Does it follow that you are afraid of both? Not necessarily, for you might in fact be comfortable around wild dogs, knowing how to deal with them. On the two-factor theory, by contrast, it seems that you must be afraid of both animals if you feel agitated and judge that each of these animals is dangerous.

I find Brogaard's formulation of the connection problem a bit unfair to Schachter and Singer due to her crude interpretation of their view. On a standard interpretation of it, an emotion is not simply a state of physical arousal plus a totally separate evaluation of the situation you are in. Rather, it is an interpretation of the physical arousal you are experiencing, involving both an evaluation of the situation ('I am endangered by this snake') and a representation of the causal connection between this evaluation and the state of arousal (Gordon, 1978). In other words, in order to experience fear at seeing an object, it is not sufficient to experience some physical arousal and judge that you are endangered by that object; you must also take that object to be the source of your physical state. Coming back to our example, the fact that you judge that the dog is dangerous (i.e., potentially poses a threat to your life) while feeling agitated does not imply that you are afraid of it. You must also think that you are feeling agitated, indeed afraid, because of its presence and not because of the presence of the snake, something you are unlikely to do given your relationship with dogs. The connection problem does not arise.

Another problem Brogaard raises against the two-factor theory is that it fails to accommodate the fact that we can experience genuine emotions, including romantic love, towards things we do not believe to be real, such as fictional characters and situations (66-68). After giving examples of emotional responses towards fictional characters, she concludes that "love and other emotions do not require beliefs or appearances as of something being real for them to obtain" (68) and that merely imagining something is sometimes sufficient to elicit emotional responses in us (though it's not too clear romantic love is easily induced by merely imagining a fictional character). Although I agree with this, I am not sure to what extent it constitutes a problem for the two-factor theory. Recall that, on this view, emotions are physical arousals which have been interpreted as being elicited by certain stimuli. This interpretation certainly involves belief in many cases, but we might wonder whether belief is necessary, whether the cognition making the link between the arousal and the world can be of a less committal sort. It seems to me that Schachter and Singer are free to be liberal on this issue, to allow cases where we interpret our physical arousal as being elicited by what we know is mere appearance. Perhaps there is a subtler problem here, but it is not clear what it is.

Now, we might wonder to what extent Brogaard's own account is different from a nuanced version of the two-factor theory. On her view, "love is an experience of your body and mind responding to your beloved's lovable qualities." (69) More generally, emotions, for Brogaard, are "perceptual or imagery appearances of the body or mind responding to the emotion-relevant properties of the object." (241) Brogaard adds that what you think is, or experience as, the cause of your feelings need not be their real cause; you can be wrong about what caused your experience. This claim is very plausible, but it is presumably something the two-factor theorist could agree with, for nowhere does the latter say that the object of one's emotion (what the emotion is directed at, which is determined by our interpretation) must be the actual cause of the physical arousal that constitutes it. In fact, the two-factor theorist's view is precisely that, no matter what actually caused a given physical arousal, this arousal can virtually constitute any kind of emotion, and be directed at any object, provided that a suitable interpretation of it occurs. On their view, indeed, the very same physical arousal can count as fear towards a snake in a given situation and as excitement towards a great landscape in another situation, depending on the interpretation it is given and regardless of what actually caused it in both situations. Without more details, it is therefore difficult to tell how Brogaard's theory differs from theirs.

Suppose Brogaard's view, suitably fleshed out, is both different from and better than the other views in the Jamesian tradition that she discusses. Is her theory the one we should accept? It is only if we follow the Jamesian tradition in thinking both that emotions are (partly or wholly) directed at the body and that emotions are perceptual experiences. Both of these claims are highly contentious, however. Against the first claim, we might think that emotions are just not experienced as being directed at the body; so why think they are in the first place? Against the second claim, we might think that, while emotions are the kind of things to be supported by reasons (I can be afraid of a tiger for a good reason), it is far from clear that a perceptual experience can be (Deonna and Teroni, 69). If emotions were perceptual experiences -- of the body or of something else -- then justifying them would not make sense, just as justifying a perceptual experience as of something red does not make sense. What would have been welcome is some motivation for following the Jamesian tradition rather than other important traditions we find in the contemporary literature.

If love is an emotion, and if an emotion is a perceptual experience, then it is not clear how love can be assessed for rationality given that perception is not the kind of thing that can be rational or irrational. Putting aside this issue, we can still appreciate Brogaard's own account of the rationality of love. Unlike other writers, Brogaard does not think that love is different from other emotions in not being assessable for rationality. And by 'rationality', presumably, she means to speak about reasons. On her view, love, just like other emotions, can be supported by reasons. Although she does not distinguish between the various kinds of reasons which might support love (moral, prudential, etc.), she takes love to be supported by reasons when it somehow 'fits' some of its object's properties. Irrational love, therefore, is unfitting love. One way love can be unfitting, Brogaard tells us, is if based on a misperception of (a relevant class of) its object's properties, even in cases where the object is objectively lovable (74). Another way it can be unfitting (hence irrational) is "if your continued love of the person would be likely to decrease your overall happiness or wellbeing." (ibid.) Given the variety of ways of being (un)fitting (perhaps there is also a moral way, an aesthetic way, etc. love can be fitting or unfitting), it would have been nice to have this notion spelled out a little more. It might turn out, for instance, that the people Brogaard criticizes are only opposed to a specific notion of fittingness (or rationality) and may well accept that love can at times be in some sense unfitting. (If you are going to die if you don't stop loving a particular person, then I take it that everyone will agree that you should stop loving that person if you can.)

An interesting feature of Brogaard's conception of the rationality of love is its commitment to a certain asymmetry between rational and irrational love. Whereas an instance of irrational love is such that you ought to stop loving the relevant person, an instance of love that is rational (i.e., supported by reasons) is only permissible. On her view, you are never irrational in not coming to love someone you have good reason to love. In addition, continuing to love someone you have good reason to love is optional, and as a result it is not irrational to stop loving her even if she hasn't changed a bit (78). (Brogaard notes that parental love might be an exception (80).) Given that I have some sympathies for these claims, I would have liked to have more details about what motivates them.

Overall, Brogaard's book is both fascinating and frustrating. It is fascinating in that it discusses so much literature -- both in philosophy and in science -- that the reader is bound to learn something new. In addition, Brogaard does not shy away from critically evaluating the ideas she presents. For instance, her criticism of the standard view of jealousy in evolutionary psychology is both appealing and thought provoking (126-130). The book is frustrating in that it talks about so many topics that it rarely, if ever, manages to get to the bottom of things. As a philosopher, I learned some interesting things about the science of emotions and love in these pages but found the philosophical points and arguments incomplete or too quick. Anecdotal and scientific details at times make it hard for the reader to pin down the arguments. This may simply reflect the fact that the book was not written specifically for a philosophical audience. It is aimed at giving a sense of what's going on in contemporary research on love, both in philosophy and in science, and the way Brogaard has chosen to attract her readers' attention is by sharing entertaining stories and fun facts about the science of love with a casual tone that will likely attract many readers. Although I personally would have preferred a more sober approach, I recommend the book to anyone who wants to know more about the topic.[1]


Deonna, J.A. and Teroni, F. (2012). The Emotions: A Philosophical Introduction. New York: Routledge

Gordon, R.M. (1978). "Emotion, Labelling, and Cognition," Journal for the Theory of Social Behaviour, 8, 125-13

[1] Thanks to Mauro Rossi for comments on a previous version of this review.