On Søren Kierkegaard: Dialogue, Polemics, Lost Intimacy, and Time

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Edward F. Mooney, On Søren Kierkegaard: Dialogue, Polemics, Lost Intimacy, and Time, Ashgate, 2007, 266pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0754658228.

Reviewed by Alastair Hannay, University of Oslo


In his Preface Edward Mooney defines the space of On Søren Kierkegaard as one where 'theology and philosophy, literature and ethics, poetry and sculpture, artistry and sacrament can mingle, affording mutual attractions and inter-animations'. When so much Kierkegaard commentary and discussion is generated by partial and divided interests, this catch-all signals a refreshing return to square one. We are ushered back to a Kierkegaard in all his authorial multiplicity, but also to where Mooney thinks philosophy should begin. His book is a skillfully and richly presented case in defense of what Kierkegaard came to believe himself: that Socrates was the thinker with whom he should be most closely associated. The book is divided into three parts, the second two including revisions of previously published essays.

On the first page of the first chapter of Part One ('Kierkegaard: A Socrates in Christendom') Mooney remarks that for Kierkegaard writing was 'always a way of questioning and consolidating what he felt to be the enigma of his life' (p. 3). The implication is that Kierkegaard's publications are designed to have us do the same, the enigma in the first instance being that of his life, but presented for the benefit of those who could see their way to confronting the enigma of theirs. This introductory chapter leaves us with the thought that rather than looking for some point of equilibrium in the writings that lets us reduce the 'provoking and puzzling' instabilities they present, we should absorb ourselves in these in our own search for whatever equilibrium we can achieve in attaining stability in our own lives.

If the reader gets an impression that Mooney's Kierkegaard is a projection back into Kierkegaard of the outcome of a search of this kind that Mooney has undertaken on his own account, this need be no criticism, indeed more a kind of confirmation. It is reasonable to suppose that any reading that touches a nerve in Kierkegaard's writings (as against the merely academic exercise that taps Kierkegaard for a topic) generates an image bearing the imprint of where that occurs, and why, in his reader.

Mooney's sustaining image is of an unsettling Kierkegaard but with the goal of a stable selfhood in view. Having Kierkegaard return to Socrates does two things. It 'tilts' Socrates (as a man of 'pious sensibility' [p. 43]) towards religion in a way that his reputation as a secular iconoclast tends to prevent, but also highlights Kierkegaard's own early involvement with Socrates. We thus form a picture of him as a thinker inspired from the start less by irony than by love and by philosophy, indeed (as in Plato's Symposium) by philosophy as love. The irony has good work to do, in Kierkegaard's case that of clearing away the complacent and muddled definitions of what the citizens of Copenhagen were content to believe it was to be a Christian. The Socratic element is visible in Kierkegaard's failure, or rather refusal, to provide any alternative blueprint. Yet another sign is the ironical ambiguity of his (late) denial that he himself was a Christian (p. 27). Mooney accordingly (chapter 3) identifies Socrates as the mold in which the young Kierkegaard was able to form and mobilize his unusual mix of talents. Mooney also has Socrates provide the answer to that famous longing of the twenty-two year old student for something for which he could 'live and die' (p. 37). Further Socratic analogies include Socratic ignorance and reticence about truth. In Kierkegaard this takes the form of moving the onus of belief in truth onto the individual.

Against the grain of the conventional take on Kierkegaard's Socrates, due to the Climacus pseudonym, as representative of a 'pagan' position against which true Christianity is sharply defined, the Socrates we meet in Mooney is as good as a Christian (though for obvious reasons not able to be one literally at the time). Part One concludes with a chapter arguing that although Plato's Socrates and Kierkegaard addressed radical wrongs in their own societies, both are speaking universally to any world suffering from the same malady: loss of subjectivity. The life-work to which, as the new Socrates, Kierkegaard devotes his talents is a revival of our ability to respond to the 'religious, moral, and aesthetic demands that appeal to us as initiates of poetry, wonder, grief, and love' (p. 85). His writings seek to re-ignite the vital spark of inwardness in the form of a non-propositional (p. 64) self-knowledge, calling for the cultivation, or retrieval, of a moral sensitivity in the face of everything that we let society put in its path (for instance fashion and learning).

The five chapters of Part Two ('Love, Ethics, and Tremors in Time') go more directly to the works themselves. The first employs dicta from Works of Love that allow Mooney to find support in Kierkegaard himself for his own positive (and trusting) portrait of its author. Here Joakim Garff's Biography is taken to task (selectively, Mooney admits) for its less than charitable portrayal and use of the texts. From The Concept of Anxiety we then have the objectively impossible but crucial idea of the 'glance', or 'instant' (Øjeblikket as in the German Augenblick), as the initial glimpse (a meeting of the eternal in time) of hope of the restoration or 'repair' of our selves. Following this, Either/Or is rescued from Alasdair MacIntyre's much-commented upon 'radical choice' reading. The work is re-contextualized on the background of the need to live out options and to educate the will, so that commitment (rather than choice as just a shot in the dark) can be real and not abstract. Mooney follows up with a discussion of the 'communicative strategies' needed by those who want to tell about their commitments but in a way that presents the options as real and not abstract to those they would like to enlighten.

Each of the last two chapters of Part Two deals with a famous pair of works that succeeded Either/Or. The 'lyrical' part of Fear and Trembling is a form of entertainment, with hero-worship of Abraham and the thrill of the 'shudder of thought'. The dialectical second part serves the cautionary purpose of telling us where not to look, or rather not to look at all, if we are to grasp the promise of hope which the book has in sight (in the thought of the particular individual's possibilities exceeding those of the universal). Repetition stages (in the form of a novel) a particular possibility, namely that of the individual regaining its world once having lost it. Here, too, the surface talk indicates what we should not be looking for, in this case a theory of 'repetition' (to help us face forward in hope) answering to the metaphysician's regaining (or recollecting) of what has been and somehow still is. If our world is to be 'habitable' (p. 174), what we hope for must be granted to us, for we have no instruments to achieve it on our own.

Part Three ('Plenitude, Prayer, and an Ethical Sublime') introduces 'personality' as the concept defining the possibilities of selfhood. This follows Kierkegaard's own hint that what Postscript has described is an itinerary towards 'personality'. The concept is a moral one, and since no moral theory can be appealed to in order to follow the itinerary, no road map can direct us on the way. The goal is acquisition of one's (other and better) self, an unselfish self that finds fulfillment in 'becoming the singular person I am and can be by relating to another' (p. 193). What shows us the way in the absence of a map or any theory is a sense we must admit in ourselves of incompleteness, one to which there correspond images that we can form, or find, of a 'new and better self'. These come to us in the shape of persons that appear to us as exemplifying a living truth, not a truth reducible to a set of propositions (215fn). Mooney links this to a version of Kant's 'sublime', ethical but also anxious sublime (p. 224), a sense of things of 'wonder, awe, or mystery' (p. 225).

With its humorous exterior, its mixture of treatise, anecdote and satire, Postscript is a 'performance' to enjoy and laugh at but also, as Mooney adds in the next chapter, one that invites audience-participation. Any tendency to stay outside is rudely interrupted by the author's concluding revocation of the work. This is not aimed at leaving the reader even more on his or her own, with no links at all to what the author may have had in mind. The revocation is designed to secure a readership free to take on what has been said but entirely on his or her individual responsibility. In the same way, to accept their guidance, you have to recede from those exemplary figures, or they yours. As Climacus says, Socrates' irony and ugliness held his students at a distance though on different planes (p. 205). As for humor, in Postscript that is designed to relocate the reader's seriousness elsewhere, by indicating that what it says must not be taken doctrinally. It is not more knowledge that we need, but a Kantian realization of the limits of what can be known, yet with a sense of there being something more.

Several other readings of Climacian humor are put aside, among them the popular analogy with Wittgenstein's disposable ladder. (Yet it is remarkable how closely the Tractatus wording follows Climacus.) Mooney sets up two extreme readings of the revocation. One is of flawed character (failure of nerve or commitment, Kierkegaard's own, presumably, rather than Climacus's) and the other that of a 'gracious, and even self-sacrificial gesture' in which, the play now over (p. 217), Kierkegaard (or just Climacus?) leaves the stage altogether. Mooney gives the former alternative a wide berth, but he steers clear of the latter too, with its post-modern, all-takers implications. There has to be some living truth in these works if they are to animate the reader in the direction of selfhood.

Mooney's concluding chapter is about silence. Some works directly invite silence while others loquaciously home in upon it. The early discourses, lacking any veneer of wit and irony, are intended to 'cultivate, form, or animate a soul without regard to the reader's status' (p. 227). Here there is no test for our intellects. It is as though Mooney were saying that they speak to us each in the silence of our own church, the test of our qualifications to appreciate them being our ability to provide ourselves with that kind of silent and receptive space, a space where what we are gives way (less easy in a real church) to a simple awareness that we are -- that 'alluring and repelling mystery of existence' (p. 242).

What of the later discourses, those that are properly discursive? (The early discourses [Taler] may be better labeled 'talks', as the Danish permits.) I read Mooney as saying that they deliver a form of understanding best acquired in silence, which seems plausible. But then, when we come to the pseudonyms, we also have a work so plainly and 'loquaciously' discursive, as well as witty and ironic, as Postscript. Of this Mooney says that its 'dialectical acrobatics' serve partly to undermine the 'allure' (p. 239) of its own form of loquacity. And of course, as this work is all the time loquaciously saying, its question (how to become a Christian) can only properly occur in a mood of responsiveness, to which the work would have us return once we have read it, just as the answer must be a practical one that develops out of that mood.

The heads of those who have actually been brought to silence by Postscript of course cannot be counted. What is certain is that this work, like others, has brought upon itself a more than fair share of loquacity. Many of us are guilty of this as well as Mooney, of course. But here we must not complain. This is not yet another attempt to accommodate Kierkegaard to the concepts and categories of current philosophical theorizing. It is a result (in Mooney's prefatory words) of a 'wrestling' with Kierkegaard's themes, and his 'grappling' with the way in which it seems figures of great worth 'so often seem to be responding to a call to be who they will be'. If, as Mooney believes, Socrates was Kierkegaard's exemplar 'from first to last' (Preface), then even if the latter does everything possible to stamp out at birth any tendency on our part to elect him as our exemplar, the theme of needing to become habitable selves in a habitable world is certainly there.

Because his own eclectic interests fruitfully match those of a kaleidoscopic authorship, Mooney provides rich support for this theme's centrality. More than scholarly (certainly not less), his book is enriched by a talent for cogent figurative expression and apt literary analogy that a review can only report.

There are things to dispute. In stressing the entertainment value of the pseudonyms Mooney plays down their part in the action. He describes Climacus's use of 'the absurd' and 'the paradox' as 'wry' (p. 40) and Postscript as 'mock-scholarly' (p. 227). As for the latter, it is true that the work refreshingly infringes the conventions of scholarly production, but even when the tone is light there is no obvious eye-winking. In general, in terms of the possibilities of selfhood in our own time it may even be dangerously regressive to airbrush Climacus out of the equation as a rhetorical device and perhaps only of local interest.

Less a criticism than an implication of Mooney's intention to 'record' his own grapplings, is the unavoidably 'complete', and thus in a way static, picture presented. Mooney himself says that he has refrained from taking us on a tour of all the works.  But he also has had to ignore the aspect of development in their production and whatever changes may have occurred in Kierkegaard's thinking on the way, for instance that once he had been happy to call himself a Hegelian, that he remained an admirer of Hegel (especially the writings on fine art), and that his fierce opposition was, not (as Mooney rightly says) because 'a kind of Hegelian plague had infected all sectors of the polis' (p. 72), but, as Mooney does not say, because and when Hegelian thought was presented by his closest rivals in Copenhagen as the solution to the malady. That thought might of course support the idea that Climacus has only local interest. Still, as Mooney says, there are 'many Kierkegaards' and in more than one sense Mooney's is a good one to add to the collection.

Mooney hopes in his Preface that the result of his struggles will point to 'new possibilities for philosophy and theology'. There may be an either/or in that, at least for philosophy. Mooney will no doubt agree that unless the term 'philosophy' recovers some of the sense it had for the Socrates of the Symposium, the possibility is that philosophy as currently pursued will run out of possibilities.