On Settling

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Robert E. Goodin, On Settling, Princeton University Press, 2012, 124pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781400845316.

Reviewed by David Schmidtz, University of Arizona


This book is Robert Goodin at his thoughtful best. The topic -- settling -- is more than one thing. We can settle down geographically, putting down roots, as settlers aim to do. We can settle debts or disputes. Life has a way of being complicated, however, and one manner of settling can run afoul of another, as when would-be settlers of land find themselves unable to settle disputes with prior claimants (a big issue in Australia and, for that matter, nearly everywhere). Historically, our greatest successes in settling disputes result from our success in settling jurisdictions -- for example, settling who has the right to make the call when it comes to settling a given person's religion.

Settling has other guises too. We can settle into a project, or into a belief. We settle for mutual cooperation, forsaking any temptation to dominate or to free ride. We settle for having a place among equals in our community by striving to make sure our neighbors and clients are better off with us than without us.

Striving, Goodin immediately notes, can be a good, indeed excellent, thing (1), yet there is such a thing as striving that needs rethinking, or that should have been preceded by striving of a different kind: striving to make sure one's striving has a point. Goodin is by no means against striving, but wants to stress that striving is not a contrast to settling so much as an activity (at its best) framed by and made possible by settling (3). Holding something relatively fixed is part of settling (6). A little less straightforwardly, fixity (30) is a framework for humanly rational striving too. At very least, we need to settle on an end, a project, in order for striving to have an end (63). Further, being able to settle along some dimensions can help us to strive along others. We also settle on a plan for deploying resources in one way rather than another, which is to say we settle on investing resources in one pursuit rather than another. We avoid overinvesting in a given pursuit when we've already achieved considerable success and when life as a whole would go better if we rerouted available resources to some other pursuit where a satisfactory outcome remains in doubt.

Settling, in several guises, thus grounds individual rational life planning. Settling also has a social dimension. Following Goodin, we'll consider various aspects of settling in turn.


There are no maximization problems except with respect to (and as defined by) a set of constraints. This mundane fact has interesting implications. First, limits imposed by the world are not imposing enough to leave us with well-defined choice problems. When we decide to look for an apartment, we operate with limited time, but the limit is dictated not by our life expectancy but by decisions we make about how to leave room in our lives for our other projects.

Goodin wants to say satisficing and settling are importantly different (34, 51). How so? Goodin says satisficing is maximizing of a sort. But in the spirit of friendly suggestion, it is worth resisting reduction here and getting the distinction between satisficing and constrained maximizing exactly right.

Consider Figure 1, a simple graph whose x and y axes bound a universe of ordered pairs consisting of x, a resource that we could invest, and y, the payoff that a given investment turns out to have. The ordered pair is an outcome of having invested a given x. Within that choice space, we define the boundaries of particular projects with constraints, largely self-imposed. Sometimes we limit how much x (time, say) we are willing to invest in finding a particular y (an apartment, say). That is to say, we put a limit on how far we are willing to go on the x-axis, as represented in Figure 1 by a vertical line. We limit inputs, which is to say our search is a form of constrained maximizing.


Figure 1. Two Stopping Rules Contrasted

The horizontal line defines a different constraint: settling for a particular level of aspiration. If I have a weekend in Las Vegas, I might impose two kinds of limit on myself. I might decide that I am limited to investing $100 in having a good time at the roulette table. Or, I might promise myself that if I ever get ahead by $100, then I will settle for that and quit while I am ahead. In the framework of Figure 1, the former is a vertical limit, the latter horizontal. Vertical and horizontal constraints are not substitutes. Indeed, they can operate together: complementary partitions that bound our searches, not letting a search get out of hand and take up more space in our lives than its object warrants.

Again, suppose you are moving to a new town and wish to find an apartment, but you realize that you must soon start preparing lectures at your new school, which means that your search for an apartment needs boundaries. If you decide to look for no more than a month, you are imposing a (vertical) constraint. If you decide to stop looking when you find a place that nicely meets your needs, you have imposed a (horizontal) constraint.

We do well to avoid confusing the content of a stopping rule with its rationale. To stop because we are satisfied with the option in hand is to satisfice. To stop and take the best option we know of at that point, because we have run out of time, is to optimize within a (temporal) constraint. The two stopping rules are distinguishable. The rules are distinguishable, and they make distinguishably crucial contributions to a life well-lived, regardless of whether they have the same ultimate rationale: namely they help us in different ways to respect the fact that the project we are pursuing is one among others.[1] As Goodin would agree, to pursue our projects in a goal-directed rather than compulsive way is to master a juggling act, which we do by taking charge of defining constraints within which we pursue any given project. We need to know, and to decide, when to quit.[2]

Genuine settling, Goodin says, is resolving to stick with something. Terminology aside, when Goodin says there is something beyond garden-variety satisficing, he is correct, but we could make the same point by saying there is something beyond garden-variety settling, namely what Goodin calls genuinely settling into a career or marriage and loving it for what it is.

Genuine settling as Goodin conceives it entails not being on the lookout for something else, although it may involve being somewhat open to new options.[3] We seldom settle on things in a way that forecloses reconsideration of decisions already made (29). There are times for taking stock, when rethinking is the best available use of our time. However, although taking everything into account sounds good in theory, one of the first things we take into account is that life is short. There is something obviously right in the Bayesian thought that to be rational is to take new information into account as it comes in (71). But that truism is not a license to treat updating as if its cost were zero. The fact remains: humanly rational choosers treat scarce resources as scarce, including the time and energy to take stock and reassess (33). We update as we can afford to update, and as it becomes obvious that updating would pay.

Note that settling on an end sometimes requires picking rather than choosing (27).[4] Alternatives may be equivalent, or incommensurable. Choice can render them commensurate, as in Sophie's Choice, but sometimes the process of commensurating the incommensurate involves tragic loss.[5] In picking cases, you prefer simply picking something to remaining on the fence, even if you have no reason to choose any particular option in preference to the others (28). One interesting dimension of real-world indeterminacy is this: indeterminacy seldom stops us. We are well-adapted to successful living in a world of occasionally equivalent and frequently incommensurate options. When we walk into a modern supermarket for the first time, we may be overwhelmed by a sea of incommensurate options, but we readily learn from experience what to ignore. We also learn simply to chose randomly when we know from experience that our options are not distinct in any way that matters. We pick up these skills quickly: for example, typically by the second time we confront the plethora of options that makes up a modern supermarket.


People sometimes find themselves with grievances. Ideally, grievances get settled. As Goodin observes, true settling up is a two-way street (24). It requires uptake. Both sides acknowledge their mutual interest in getting on with their lives on mutually respectful terms -- not necessarily thinking all wrongs have been undone but nonetheless focusing on the future, without resentment or the corrosive irritation of interminable blaming.

The price of not moving on is that one wakes up some day to find that one has not, well, moved on (45). Settling debts enables people to move on. Just today,[6] I read a report saying that American states with the highest rates of foreclosure and delinquent mortgage payments (unsurprisingly) are those with the greatest legal barriers to expedited foreclosure. The official intent apparently is to avoid forcing debtors to cut their losses and move on. Yet, those states tend to be states where housing prices and employment rates are not recovering from the crash. Foreclosures in those states can take three to four years even when the foreclosure is uncontested, which also (for better and for worse) limits the latitude of lending institutions for entertaining applications from new clients. Goodin might dislike the example, yet it confirms his understanding of the social value of settling. In his words, "providing a settled socio-legal environment within which people can plan and conduct their affairs is the whole point of the rule of law" (46). Scholars as diverse as Hayek, Raz, and Fuller would agree. Settling in this sense is an indispensable foundation of community: a crucial step in our forming reliable mutual expectations, thereby reducing the price of living and working in close proximity (35, 40).[7] There is value in being someone who can be relied on, someone around whom plans can be made. Prosperous nations are the ones that encourage people to show up at the marketplace to exchange the fruits of their best efforts. When people can count on each other to do that, they make each other rich. But even that tends to involve a good bit of settling.


We need to be able to trust institutions, too, as Goodin observes (41). Problems evolve over time, and laws designed to solve problems often need to evolve with the problems. Accordingly, the rule of law cannot be settled once and for all. It too will evolve. Nevertheless, a rule of law is something essentially settled. Constitutions can do a lot of good if, but only if, we can trust them to remain relatively fixed (48).

This is not merely a matter of brute predictability. The Soviet Union was predictable in ways that did not promote prosperity. For an institution to be trustworthy is for it to be a framework in which people adapt to each other in mutually beneficial ways. They build mutually beneficial community within that framework. Where people are trusted and worthy of trust, they settle on projects and relationships that make the world a better place. In any case, living in a framework of predictable rules and expectations is one (if only one) essential ingredient of a recipe for progress.

In conclusion, we settle on projects. We pursue them over protracted periods, managing the implied juggling act by settling for what is merely satisfactory along other dimensions of our lives. Settling is an indispensable complement to striving. This is a sociological as well as a psychological truth. Settling enables us to strive and also to be good neighbors who can form a culture of mutual intelligibility in which we are able to strive far more successfully together than we ever could on our own (74).

This little book is an exercise in settling, not only a discussion of it, for Goodin has a lot more wisdom to share than he can capture in seventy-four pages. But the result of his effort is a manifestly important and worthy contribution to philosophical reflection, and no less so because it settled for being simply that rather than aspiring to say the first or last word on the subject.

[1] Note that one could be an immoderate satisficer: someone who has a concrete aspiration but whose aspiration is extremely high. Or one could be a moderate maximizer: someone whose vision of perfection is realistically achievable with modest effort. The distinction between satisficing and optimizing strategy does not track the distinction between the virtue of moderation and the vice of immoderation. Also, there is such a thing as a rational perfectionist: someone who sees that true excellence has been achieved, feels satisfied, and moves on. A recurring theme of Goodin's again emerges here: part of the point of settling in one compartment of endeavor is to be able to get on with our endeavors in other compartments.

[2] Sometimes we work so hard for so long, but eventually come to accept that we are not going to win this one (68). Is there any such thing as knowing it is time to quit? Surely the answer is yes. Often, though, the answer comes to us by degrees and in riddles. Sometimes the moment never comes when it obviously is time to reconsider (70).

[3] I concluded twenty years ago that satisficing is at the heart of humanly rational choice, enabling us to rationally choose ends and define projects, and even to have reasons for altruism. Most recently, I have been studying our capacity rationally to call a halt to our quest for "reasons all the way down" when we get to a point of having insufficient reason to be seeking further reasons. See my "Rationality Within Reason," Journal of Philosophy 89 (1992) p. 445-66; "Choosing Ends," Ethics 104 (1994), 226-51; "Reasons for Altruism," Social Philosophy & Policy 10 (1993), 52-68. These articles are available at www.davidschmidtz.com. Work in progress includes "On Being Overcome By Reason."

[4] See Edna Ullmann-Margalit and Sidney Morgenbesser, "Picking and Choosing," Social Research, 44 (1977), 757-85.

[5] See my "A Place For Cost-Benefit Analysis," Philosophical Issues (Noûs annual supplement) 11(2001), 148-71. Also available at www.davidschmidtz.com.

[6] Wall Street Journal, January 9, 2013, A12.

[7] Hobbes posits that we are, along some dimensions, insatiable, as Goodin notes (1). Yet,  Hobbes deems it imperative that we should keep covenants when we can be sure that our partners will do (or already have done) likewise. What makes this imperative rational is that failing to observe it amounts to declaring war on partners who do their part in good faith. Where vainglory abides, free riding presents itself not only as parasitic but as an expression of contempt. In this way, Hobbes counsels us to settle for the payoff of mutual cooperation. Indeed, this imperative is so profound that Hobbes considers it a law of nature.