On the Ethics of Torture

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Uwe Steinhoff, On the Ethics of Torture, SUNY Press, 2013, 191pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781438446226.

Reviewed by Gregory Fried, Suffolk University


Torture is a problem from hell. Confronting torture seriously means weighing some of our most cherished principles and traditions against threats that once might have seemed fantastical but after 9/11 no longer do. On the one hand is a long-standing taboo against torture as a profound violation of human dignity. Deeply influential institutions, such as the Catholic Church,[1] have taken an absolutist stand against torture, and the United Nations Convention against Torture, to which the United States is a signatory, allows "No exceptional circumstances whatsoever" to undermine a total ban on the practice.[2] On the other hand are harrowing scenarios, some hypothetical but others now all too real, which pinion us with a desperate need for life-saving information.

Into this hell steps an important book by Uwe Steinhoff, On the Ethics of Torture. This book is rather odd in tone. Steinhoff makes the case for torture in certain limited circumstances, and he evidently has become indignant with some absolutist opponents of torture, who have accused him of "careless philosophizing" about torture scenarios (ix) and of undermining ethical discourse (chapter 7). In response, Steinhoff frequently treats the arguments of his opponents with scorn and sarcasm. Furthermore, in philosophical style, this book trades heavily on what has become an epidemic in contemporary applied ethics: extravagant hypotheticals. Steinhoff litters his arguments with often gleefully graphic examples involving weapons that cause excruciating pain, disintegration guns, and vaginas that kill. Even making allowances, I find this rather hard to take; perhaps that is a merely aesthetic reaction, but I will return to it after treating Steinhoff's main argument.

That argument is indeed important, one that any absolutist opponent of torture (including myself[3]) should take seriously. The core thesis is blisteringly simple: "torture is justifiable in certain narrowly circumscribed circumstances, in particular in certain self-defense situations" (ix). Steinhoff convincingly insists that his limited defense of torture is not based on consequentialist considerations. Quite the contrary, Steinhoff calls himself a "threshold deontologist" (44, 77); he supports deontological principles until a threshold of unacceptable consequences overrides the principle in question. This is not unusual for a deontologist (think of the Kantian who would lie to the Nazi hunting Jews),[4] and Steinhoff is still justified in calling himself one, because (echoing Ronald Dworkin) taking rights seriously means allowing rights to trump utility most if not all of the time (43). What Steinhoff opposes is absolutism about acts. This is where the extravagant hypotheticals come in: to demonstrate that for any act you might think of as always absolutely wrong, we can conjure a conceivable scenario in which a reasonable person would have to allow that act.

This is not the first book to make a right-based defense of torture,[5] but it makes the case powerfully and rebuts in detail the major anti-torture authors, such as David Luban, Henry Shue, David Sussman, and Jeremy Waldron. Steinhoff defines torture as "the knowing infliction of continuous or repeated extreme physical suffering for other than medical purposes" (7), defining "extreme" as anything roughly equivalent to "drilling on the unprotected nerve of a tooth" (9). Steinhoff discounts short "shocks" of pain, and he is skeptical about counting psychological pain a torture (9). This excludes much often considered torture: exposure to phobias, mock executions, and the like, as well as some practices that mix the physical and psychological, such as sleep or sensory deprivation, and exposure to temperature extremes. For the sake of argument, though, we should grant Steinhoff's restrictive definition, because if he can succeed on its basis, that is decisive enough. We can quibble another time about its parameters.

Self-defense is the heart of Steinhoff's argument: "People have a right to defend themselves or others against wrongful aggression, in particular if the aggression is life-threatening" (11). This premise is not consequentialist; it is about the right to defend oneself and others against unjust attack. Some might object to a right to self-defense (a pacifist might believe that death is preferable to acts of violence), but Steinhoff argues well that even Kant's deontology supports a prima facie right to self-defense, and so also a duty for a legitimate government to uphold that right in protecting its citizens against aggression (133).

Steinhoff's next move is to show that interrogative torture -- never punitive or sadistic torture (7) -- may be necessary for self‑defense. Here Steinhoff is on most solid ground with real-life "Dirty Harry" examples, the Daschner and Mook cases, where German police captured kidnappers who then refused to reveal where their respective victims were hidden and presumably in grave danger.  In the Daschner case, the kidnapper was threatened with torture and gave up the location of the child, who had already been murdered, but the police did not know that.  In the Mook case, the child, who had been imprisoned in a wooden box, was saved when the kidnapper revealed the location after a beating (which we can take as a case of torture for the sake of argument).  In each case, the police tortured the kidnappers and obtained information about where the child was hidden. Tragically, the Daschner child was already dead, but the Mook child was saved. Steinhoff reasonably asks why interrogational torture in such cases would be wrong, where there is no other credible option and the torture is both necessary and proportional. If we may use lethal force in self‑defense, why not torture? Also, if torture is the only option, it does not matter that torture sometimes fails or has a low chance of success; a victim of attempted rape, armed only with a sharp pencil, would still have a right to self-defense with that.

Absolutists have often argued that torture is worse than killing in self‑defense, but Steinhoff finds this unconvincing. To see why, we need to step back from torture and consider other horrible things we sometimes think are right if we take seriously the right to self‑defense against unjust assault. Violence, including killing, can be horrific (19), as is torture, but may still be right if necessary to save a victim of unjust attack. This is partly a function of nomenclature: We don't call justifiable violence "assault" or justifiable killing "murder," we call them "self-defense." There is no such terminological distinction for inflicting justifiable pain; it is all called torture. Steinhoff asserts that given the choice, for oneself or a loved one, between being killed or being tortured, we would generally choose torture. True, as torture's duration and intensity increase, it is more and more likely to cause lasting physical or psychological damage, as studies have shown. "In contrast to this," Steinhoff counters with characteristic sarcasm, "empirical studies show that not 20, not 30, not 98, but 100 percent of those who have been killed are dead" (23). Now, this is from the perspective of the target of the act, not the actor, and there are deeper complexities at work that I cannot address here, but Steinhoff makes the cogent claim that killing is usually worse than mostforms of torture. Killing ends everything forever, torture may be survived, so if we accept the former in self‑defense, then we must accept the latter.

This core argument does a lot of work for Steinhoff. Absolutists often argue that torture is a horror because it breaks the will. As Steinhoff points out, torture does not always do so, but even when it does, so do many things we consider acceptable in collective self-defense, such as plea-bargaining with criminals and coercive detention (65). Anti-torture absolutists also argue that torture impermissibly targets someone who is defenseless, but other permissible forms of self-defense can do that, argues Steinhoff (93-4). Consider artillery out of enemy range, or a police sniper targeting an unarmed kidnapper about to push a child off a roof. But can there be self-defense if the defenseless target of torture is no longer a threat? Steinhoff reasonably answers by defining an active attack as follows:

one completes one's action x at the last point where one could have prevented the intended effect from coming about. Thus the terrorist [in a ticking bomb scenario] and the kidnapper are engaged in their attack on the child or the persons to be killed in the explosion for as long as they refuse to give the life-saving information. (37)

Even in captivity, the terrorist or kidnapper is still acting, still attacking. The rights of innocents trump the rights of aggressors.

While Steinhoff defends torture in self-defense, he argues adamantly against its institutionalization, such as by the "torture warrants" advocated by Alan Dershowitz: We do not need institutionalization because such cases are rare enough (64) that its hypothetical benefits "are not worth the risks" (67); I will return to this problematic point later. Steinhoff's argument for the legalization of torture under necessity statutes, but against its institutionalization, links to his refutation of what he calls the "ticking social bomb" objection to torture, made by Shue and others, that if we allow torture in rare and limited cases, it will spread and corrupt a society's institutions. Against this threat of the inevitable "metastatic growth" of torture (66), Steinhoff points to the 1988 Mook case: torture helped rescue a buried child, yet Germany suffered no slide into generalized torture (58). For Steinhoff, the principle that "hard cases make bad law" actually supports limited use of torture because the absolutist anti-torture position "shields an aggressor from necessary and proportionate defensive measures by or on behalf of the victim . . . [and therefore] actually aids and abets the aggressor and violates the rights and the human dignity of the victim" (60). In a contest between the rights of an innocent victim and an unjustified aggressor, the victim's should triumph -- as they do when we kill aggressors in self-defense, or imprison them for crimes, despite the otherwise presumptive rights to life or to liberty.

These are the key elements of Steinhoff's self-defense argument for torture, and they are enough to move an anti-torture absolutist such as myself. But how far?

There are several serious problems with Steinhoff's argument. The first of these has to do with the scope of self-defense. Self-defense, understood broadly to include other-defense, has long stood as the bedrock justification for jus ad bellum, justice in going to war. Steinhoff's examples touch on private self‑defense, using torturous pain against an attacker when you cannot call on police aid, and police defense against criminal threats within a state. But what about a nation's military self‑defense against foreign aggression?

Steinhoff wants to argue that the circumstances that justify torture because of the dire need for life-saving information, such as kidnappings or ticking bombs, are exceedingly rare. But these are cases within states, not between states (or significant non‑state actors) at war. In wartime, the number of enemies with potentially life-saving information rises dramatically: field officers with knowledge of impending attacks; civilian leaders with knowledge of overall strategic plans; scientists with knowledge of weapons systems; and so on. May they be tortured when captured? Steinhoff insists that his interest in torture "was aroused by the German Daschner case, that is, by a child-kidnapping case, not by the 'terrorist threat' the American debate is obsessed with" (x). He derides the American obsession with "'the war on terrorism' and the silly and often racist 'us-versus-them' ideology that accompanies it" (x), and he deplores Abu Ghraib. Steinhoff concludes that if

torturing an Islamic terrorist is justified to avert the explosion of a ticking bomb that would kill thousands of innocent Americans or Israelis, it then is obviously also justified to torture a Christian or Jewish state terrorist if by doing so one can avert a more of less indiscriminate bombing campaign by the American or Israeli air force that would (once again) kill thousands of innocent Palestinians, Iraqis, or Afghans. (x; my emphasis)

But this is precisely the problem. The ticking bomb scenario straddles police and military action for self‑defense, because a domestic or a foreign enemy might plant it. Steinhoff wants to argue against the institutionalization of torture because "The ticking bomb case or the Dirty Harry [kidnapping] case is a very rare case," and so "it is safe to assume that all the torture that happened or happens in Abu Ghraib, Afghanistan, and Guantanamo simply has nothing to do with ticking bombs or hostages who are about to die" (64). He says the latter are exceptions. Yet his own example that preventing an "indiscriminate bombing campaign" would justify torturing a "state terrorist" (presumably he means a civilian or military commander with information that might impede such an campaign) shows that in war such scenarios are far from "enormously rare" (67). Indeed, they may well be the norm, given how vital wartime intelligence and how devastating an enemy attack can be. So the "state terrorist" will not be a rare individual but rather may be hundreds, thousands, or more. If they possess decisive military intelligence as offenders in an unjust war, then by Steinhoff's own argument, even in custody they are still actually attacking and thereby violating the rights of the victim community.

Steinhoff relies on the very rarity of examples of police torture in Germany, a nation that has not suffered military attack or been (substantially) at war for nearly 70 years, to show that legalized self-defensive torture need not metastasize (72-3). But if torture against state (or quasi-state) terrorists is justified, as Steinhoff himself admits and as self-defense at the national level would require, that will justify torture on a much larger scale, and normalization and institutionalization seem inevitable. That is precisely what happened in the American case. When Bush's Office of Legal Counsel justified torture against some terrorists, fearing other massive attacks against civilians after 9/11,[6] the practices, we now know, did metastasize institutionally across theaters of the world‑wide "War on Terror."[7] This is rather powerful evidence. It does no good, as Steinhoff attempts, to say that "the torture in Guantanamo is not self‑defensive nor an instance of a justifying emergency" (157) and may not be used against terrorists for "fishing expeditions" in order "to find out more about their networks" (158), because one can simply say that the American torture regime was botched. If, as Steinhoff admits, "state terrorists" (i.e., large-scale aggressors) may be tortured to prevent bombing campaigns, then when there is good reason to believe that captured aggressors have vital information that could save lives, then they may justly be tortured, and America's criminal and incompetent torture regime is not an argument against properly employed wartime torture any more than a botched or disproportional attempt at more conventional self-defense would refute self-defense in general.

A second problem arises from Steinhoff's argument from necessity. He allows that in very rare cases, it might be right to torture an innocent. Steinhoff concocts the unfortunately plausible case of a sadistic but truthful soldier who gives a captured father the choice "to either waterboard his son for 30 minutes or to have him executed" (42). For Steinhoff, the right choice is clear: torture the child. If so, then Steinhoff must "bite the bullet" and ask, what about a ticking-bomb terrorist: if he won't break, may we torture his innocent child in front of him? Steinhoff argues that this would not be justified because "there is no evidence that would suggest that torturing a person by torturing somebody he deeply cares for is more effective in retrieving the vital information than torturing the first person himself" (42). This strikes me as a cop-out, given Steinhoff's argument. He frequently resorts to fantastical thought experiments to demonstrate that certain ethical outcomes are at least conceivable and therefore undermine absolutist prohibitions. Well, isn't it conceivable that a terrorist might have congenital analgia, the inability to feel pain, but still feel deeply about his child? Or what if time were very short and the stakes very high -- say, a nuclear bomb planted in a city? Steinhoff is willing to sacrifice some innocents for thousands or millions of other innocents. As he says: "You do the math" (52). Horrendously, this is not conjectural: John Yoo, formerly of the Bush administration's Office of Legal Counsel, has argued that the president has the authority to order the crushing of the testicles of a terrorist's child.[8]

And this brings us to my third reservation about Steinhoff's argument: its heavy reliance on hypotheticals. Thought experiments have done yeoman's work in philosophy ever since the tale of the ring of Gyges in Plato's Republic. There clearly is a place for them in testing our moral intuitions, yet they have been taken too far down the trolley track in contemporary ethical theory. At issue here is modality: the meaning of the possible for making sense of ethical life. Let me suggest two modes of the possible. One is the merely conceivable, which involves science fiction elements or extraordinarily rare circumstances, things that are not logically impossible or outright violations of the laws of nature. The other mode is the genuinely plausible, scenarios that are either actually possible (because they have happened) or feasible given a reasonable construal of existing realities. I would like to narrow the use of hypothetical to the latter set of plausible cases and coin a new term, hyperthetical, for the merely conceivable.

I will grant that hypertheticals, such as the ring of Gyges or "philosophical zombies" (a recent craze in philosophy of mind) may be useful in testing our intuitions, ethical and otherwise, but they have limited value for thinking about what is right to do in the world we actually inhabit; indeed, they may impede good ethical judgment. At issue is the status of acts we would normally consider anathema. For any such taboo act -- rape, torture, child abuse -- it is possible to imagine a hyperthetical that would make us say, "Well, gosh, in a case like that, I guess we would have to allow it." Steinhoff does just this for rape in the case of "Innocent Jenny" attacked by "Serial Killer," who both happen to be naked: "Jenny, who is a doctor, is currently treating her vaginal infection with a potent new ointment, which has the side-effect of killing any man whose penis is exposed to it long and severely enough" (149). In Steinhoff's scenario, Jenny and Killer struggle, and she manages to force his penis into her vagina while he says "No," thereby justifiably raping him to death in self-defense.

If this is not a hyperthetical, I don't know what is. The point is this: to say that there are some things we should not do because they are wrong does not mean it is inconceivable that there might be extraordinary exceptions. The threshold of exception may be higher or lower depending on the act in question, with lying at the low end and things like killing and torture at the high end.

The reality is that the question of torture is part of an ongoing debate with real practical consequences, and Steinhoff owes us a fuller story about what his argument justifies. A kidnapped child buried alive is now sadly a plausible hypothetical, but as we move along the range of modality to hyperthetical scenarios, something dangerous happens. Here I want to make an Aristotelian or Burkean argument about the ethical habits of both citizens and state institutions. Such habits are fragile, as torture's explosion in the "War of Terror" demonstrates. Jane Mayer has written about how Brigadier General Patrick Finnegan, then dean at West Point, led a delegation to the producers of the TV show "24" (literally a "ticking" deadline), because it had convinced so many West Point cadets that torture is justified, especially as employed by the show's hero, Jack Bauer, in dealing with life-and-death emergencies. The delegation did not convince the producers to alter the program's message, and "24" has been one of the most popular shows with troops stationed abroad after 9/11.[9] I know first hand how seriously the military takes this concern, because my father and I were invited to West Point to discuss torture with faculty and students in 2011, after our own book on the subject came out.

The point is an Aristotelian one: We cannot form a shared culture of ethical life on the basis of outlandish hypertheticals. Practical wisdom, Aristotle's phronêsis, depends on developing ethical judgment and decision-making around hypotheticals that are tied to circumstances that we can recognize and share as plausible touchstones for life as we live it, so that when an exception does occur, we can deal with it precisely as an exception. Hypertheticals, such as Naked Jenny, or torturing innocent children, have the effect of unhinging practical wisdom from the historical context that any robust community of shared norms must learn to inhabit. They are a Trojan Horse: by accepting a remote possibility as setting the standard for action, the everyday and ordinary are utterly transformed. This is why an institution like West Point depends on a code of honor and on absolutes such as the prohibition on torture: a presumptive inconceivability imbues both individuals and communities with the requisite ethical intuitions, even if in rare cases these may be up‑ended.

But after 9/11, is a nuclear bomb planted in a city still just a hyperthetical? Maybe not. Torture is a problem from hell. It tortures us by putting cherished principles on the rack and forcing us to give in to exceptions. Torture is in fact worse than killing in this sense: history matters, context matters, and at this time in our history, it is torture -- not killing, not rape, and certainly not disintegration ray guns and killer vaginas -- that threatens to overturn principles vital to the foundation of liberal democracy. This is no hyperthetical concern, given the spread of torture under Bush. I will cede to Steinhoff that there are conceivable and isolated hypotheticals, such as the Mook case, and now, horrifyingly, the planted nuclear bomb, that could make torture justified in self‑defense. But just as Steinhoff calls himself a threshold deontologist, we should stand for a threshold absolutism on torture. We must insist on the wrongfulness of torture, even if we accept that there might be exceptional cases where the wrong may be excused. Consider the intuition that while we might give soldiers in a just war medals and a parade, we should recoil at doing this for torturers, even in something like the Mook case. Above all, we must never make such excuses ex ante, as a matter of open law or secret policy, much less make torture permissible in war, where it will indeed metastasize. Here I disagree with Steinhoff about legalization: violations of such a foundational norm must seek pardon ex post facto, not license ex ante. It may seem paradoxical that the justified may still be wrong, but such paradoxes are a feature of the tragic in the human condition, and we must mark the outer limits of hell as best we can.


I am grateful for conversations with Charles Fried, Mandeep Minhas, and Jeppe von Platz, which helped me develop the ideas in this review; its faults are entirely my own.

[1] See Pope John Paul II, Veritatis Splendor, section 80.

[3] Charles Fried and Gregory Fried, Because It Is Wrong: Torture, Privacy and Presidential Power in the Age of Terror (New York: W. W. Norton, 2010).

[4] See Charles Fried, Right and Wrong (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1978), 10.

[5] For example: Stephen Kershnar, For Torture: A Rights-Based Defense (Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2011).

[6] For an account of the perceived threat level following 9/11 and the Bush administration, see Jack Goldsmith, The Terror Presidency: Law and Judgment Inside the Bush Administration (New York: W. W. Norton, 2009).

[8] For John Yoo’s remarks, see Sidney Blumenthal, “Meek, mild and menacing,” Salon, January 12, 2006, retrieved May 5, 2014. 

[9] See Jane Mayer, “Whatever It Takes: The Politics of the Man Behind ‘24,’” The New Yorker, February 19, 2007.