On the Free Choice of the Will, On Grace and Free Choice, and Other Writings

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Augustine, On the Free Choice of the Will, On Grace and Free Choice, and Other Writings, Peter King (ed., tr.), Cambridge University Press, 2010, xli + 264 pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521001298.

Reviewed by Roland J. Teske, S.J., Marquette University


This volume in Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy contains new translations of three complete works of Augustine on free choice and grace, namely, On the Free Choice of the Will (De libero arbitrio), On Grace and Free Choice (De gratia et libero arbitrio), and On Reprimand and Grace (De correptione et gratia). It also contains new translations of the section in the Reconsiderations (Retractationes) concerning On the Free Choice of the Will, two short passages from the Confessions, and a longer passage from On the Gift of Perseverance (De dono perseverantiae).

On the Free Choice of the Will was begun in Rome soon after Augustine's baptism by Saint Ambrose in Milan in 387. On Grace and Free Choice and On Reprimand and Grace were written some forty years later. The Confessions was written approximately ten years after he began On the Free Choice of the Will, which he completed a few years before he began the Confessions. On the Gift of Perseverance was written after On Grace and Free Choice and On Reprimand and Grace, just before Augustine's death in 430.

The texts are translated into clear and readable English and edited and annotated by Peter King, who is certainly an accomplished Augustine scholar and philosopher. King has added a substantial introduction, a chronology of Augustine's life, several pages of suggested further readings, some notes on the texts used, an index of works cited as well as a subject index, and a list of abbreviations. The translation of Augustine's often long and complicated sentences is frequently clarified by the use of alphabetically marked subdivisions that are certainly helpful for modern readers when faced with Augustine's often long and convoluted sentence structure. I did not check the translation for accuracy line by line, but did find one or two occasions where I found myself looking at the Latin to see just what it was that Augustine was saying.

The introduction provides a clear and succinct account of Augustine's intellectual development and then focuses on the themes of freedom and grace. King rightly emphasizes Augustine's intellectual debt to neoplatonism, which provided him with the key to understanding that the evil human beings do is not some positive reality but a privation of an order that ought to exist in the human will. Augustine's neoplatonic philosophy also helped him to see how there could be evil in a world created by an all-knowing, all-loving, and all-powerful God. For with the help of neoplatonic metaphysics and the preaching of Ambrose he came to conceive of God as incorporeal or spiritual and to understand that evil is not the sort of eternal power in opposition to the good God that the Manichees, who were the principal target in On the Free Choice of the Will, had held evil to be. King's introduction clearly articulates Augustine's understanding of the freedom of the will as it is found in On the Free Choice of the Will and also clearly spells out what Augustine meant by grace and perseverance in his later works in clear and modern language that the modern student will surely find helpful.

Although the first book of On the Free Choice of the Will was written in 387, the latter two books were not completed until 391-395. The first book develops a definition of sin that is reworked in the second book, while the third book confronts the difficult question of why God, the cause of the will, is not also the cause of sin. An interesting section of book three explores the four hypotheses concerning how human souls came to be embodied and aims to show the justice of God on whichever hypothesis might be true. Although book two of the work contains what is often considered to be Augustine's proof for the existence of God (which is an essential part of his free-will defense of the goodness of God, given the presence of evil in the world), the introduction passes over any discussion of the structure and soundness of that argument. Similarly, although book three contains the celebrated passage on the four hypotheses concerning the soul's presence in bodies, the introduction does not examine this thorny topic, although the role allotted to free choice varies in accord with the different hypotheses and also differs from the view that he would soon adopt as in the answer to Simplician's questions.

The first of the two short selections from the Confessions describes the famous garden scene in which Augustine experienced the struggle between his will to respond to God's call and his inability to do so, although it was his will that refused to obey his will. The second tells us of his earlier inability to understand that free choice is the cause of our doing evil and that God's just judgment is the cause of our suffering evil.

On Grace and Free Choice and On Reprimand and Grace were both written for the Catholic monks of the African town of Hadrumetum, who found difficulties with some of Augustine's anti-Pelagian teachings. The first work addresses the objection that the doctrine of grace is incompatible with freedom of choice. In response Augustine argues mainly from scripture that both are necessary, although without grace there is no freedom to do good. The second work takes up an objection from the monks that the abbot ought not reprimand a delinquent monk but ought simply to pray for him, since the monk cannot behave as he ought without the help of grace. Again, Augustine argues for the compatibility of reprimands and free choice.

The selection from On the Gift of Perseverance, a work written for the monks of Provence who had similar problems with some of Augustine's works against the Pelagians, takes up again Augustine's defense of what he had written in On the Free Choice of the Will. The Pelagians claimed to find in his early work what they themselves held about the ability of the human will. Augustine insists that in his early work he was writing only with the Manichees in mind, but points out that even then -- well before the emergence of the Pelagian controversy, which began in 410 or 411 -- he indicated the need for the grace of God. The selection also presents Augustine's teaching on predestination, by which some human beings are gratuitously chosen for salvation and others are justly left in their sins, whether inherited from Adam or committed by their own will, unto their eternal damnation.

Despite all the good things about the present volume, I found it troubling that King seems to regard Augustine's teaching on free choice and grace as an harmonious whole and gives little, if any, attention to the radical change in Augustine's thinking about human freedom that occurred at the time of his answering the questions sent to him by Simplician, Ambrose's successor as bishop of Milan and a man who had played an important role in Augustine's conversion to Catholic Christianity in 386-387. While most scholars sees Ad Simplicianum, written in 396-397, as a turning point in his thinking on the relation between grace and free choice, King seems to accept uncritically Augustine's explanation of why he passed over the role of grace in On the Free Choice of the Will almost entirely. However, Augustine himself admitted in his work On the Predestination of the Saints (originally the first part of On the Gift of Perseverance), that he, in discussing God's choice of Jacob rather than Esau in Ad Simplicianum, "worked hard in defense of the free choice of the human will, but the grace of Christ won out" (ch. 4/8). Grace did not, of course, win out in the sense that it did away with free choice, but in the sense that the initiative for our salvation was found to lie in the grace of God, not in our free choice, as Augustine seems to have held at least in the early part of On the Free Choice of the Will. Moreover, in On the Predestination of the Saints, Augustine admits that he was earlier "mistaken, thinking that the faith by which we believe in God is not a gift of God, but that we have it from ourselves" (ch. 3/7).

Augustine's teaching on the relation between freedom of choice and the grace of God underwent significant development over the years in his many writings on these topics, and the work for Simplician is generally taken to mark a third conversion after his first conversion to Manichaeism and his second to Catholic Christianity. In this third conversion the grace of God won out over free choice so that Augustine no longer held it true that nothing is so in the power of the will as the will itself and that in order to have a good will, all one had to do was will it, as he argued in On the Free Choice of the Will 1.12.26. However, one cannot do everything in a book, and the fresh translations of these important works on free choice and grace certainly are a valuable contribution to Augustine scholarship.