On the Genealogy of Universals: The Metaphysical Origins of Analytic Philosophy

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Reviewed by Kevin C. Klement, University of Massachusetts Amherst


This book offers a detailed look at the initial development of the debate over the universal/particular distinction in the context of the emergence of analytic philosophy, especially in Britain, in roughly the first three decades of the 20th century. The main figures discussed are G.E. Moore, Bertrand Russell, Alfred North Whitehead, G. F. Stout, F. P. Ramsey and the early Ludwig Wittgenstein. The word "Genealogy" in the title is true to its Nietzschean overtones: the book is in part a historical deconstruction of how the debate came to be framed the way it is. It argues that our contemporary understanding of this history is oversimplified and in need of supplementation by examining positions, arguments and nuances that have been neglected in the intervening years.

Perhaps the major theme of the work is that the early analytic philosophers found compelling arguments for rejecting the Kantian idea that the distinction between substances and attributes, or between particulars and universals, is something that can be known to hold a priori. Some of these figures, at least temporarily, advanced "categorical monisms", according to which all the constituents of a fact or state of affairs or proposition are alike in their logical role. Others advanced categorical pluralisms that embraced more distinctions in logical kind than allowed for by the traditional division between particulars, monadic relations, dyadic relations, and so on. Even those in the tradition who did hold a fairly conventional version of the dualism between universals and particulars found difficulties with it and often were able to solve problems only by taking the categorization of the possible logical forms of facts to be something discovered only with empirical research, rather than something knowable a priori.

Before MacBride delves into the later developments he sketches, in Chapter 1, their Kantian background. In Kant's philosophy, the distinction between substance and attribute was identified as a pure concept of the understanding or category, something which is not forced upon us either by what we experience, or by the avoidance of contradiction. The applicability of the distinction is known synthetically a priori as a requirement of the formal features of the kind of rational cognition we employ, or any we would recognize as such. In particular, dividing the world into substances and attributes is necessary for the "synthetic unity of apperception", or a rational being's ability to keep track of its own various experiences as states of one subject.

Chapter 2 deals with early Moore's break with Kant and idealism generally. For Moore, Kant's position failed to provide for either the genuine truth or the necessity of such distinctions: something's being necessary for our forms of cognition is not an absolute necessity, and may not reflect objective reality. Moore provided an act/object account of consciousness where the objects of awareness -- which Moore called concepts -- are independent from the subject. Moore took ordinary things to be complex concepts containing the concept of existence, and generally, complex concepts to be mind-independent "propositions", possessing their capacity for truth, falsity and logical relationships independently of the mind. Because such propositions are the very reality our judgments related to them involve, their truth or falsehood cannot be understood as a relation or correspondence to a distinct reality. Because Moore in effect builds the conditions for the world to be intelligible to us into what he takes reality itself to be, MacBride thinks his early realistic philosophy can be likened, ironically, to "absolute idealism" in Hegel's sense, though I must admit I find it obscure what this label is supposed to entail, or in what sense this should be seen as ironic.

Further developments of Moore's views on "concepts" are the focus of the next chapter. Moore included among concepts both such things as redness and goodness, which others would have classified as attributes, as well as spatial locations and temporal instants, which others would regard as particulars. An ordinary perceivable object or event would also include the special concept of existence. The most basic existential propositions would be understood as, say, redness at location l at time t, and without some artificiality, it's not possible to think of this in a subject/predicate form. Any of the concepts could be regarded as what the proposition is "about". MacBride compares early Moore's notion of concept to Strawson's later notion of a feature, as well as to Bradley's earlier notion of a logical idea. Like Bradley's logical ideas, Moorean concepts have a kind of generality: the same concepts may feature in different propositions. But this does not make them universals in the usual sense. MacBride finishes the chapter with discussion of Moore's conception of truth as involving different ways the concepts occurring in a proposition are related to each other, noting that these cannot very easily be understood as straightforward part/whole relations, but suggesting that Moore does not provide a very clear account. MacBride hints that something like Russell's conception of incomplete symbols may be necessary to provide an elegant solution to this worry.

Chapter 4 turns to early Russell's philosophy, beginning with his initial movements away from the broadly Kantian framework of his (1897) Essay on the Foundations of Geometry in an 1898 manuscript "An Analysis of Mathematical Reasoning". There Russell maintains a distinction between things, which cannot be predicated or attributed to other things, qualities, which are universal properties that can exist at different places, and attributes, or particular instantiations of properties. His views on the analysis of logical form changed again while writing his Critical Exposition of the Philosophy of Leibniz (1900) as Russell diagnosed problems with Leibniz's philosophy as an incompatibility between his pluralism and his understanding of all objectively true propositions as having a subject-predicate form. Building on some criticisms made by Bradley, Russell found Leibniz's conception of substance incoherently committed both to substances in effect being collections or series of their qualities and states, but also distinct from them. This led Russell in his own philosophy to focus more on relations, and to deny that in a true subject-predicate proposition there is any sense in which the predicate is internal to the subject. It also prompted him to drop attributes from his own philosophy, with the differences between instantiations of the same quality attributed just to the different instantiators.

Chapters 5 and 6 return to Moore, and his later changes of mind. Moore reintroduced something like a universal/particular distinction in his "Identity" paper of 1900-01 in part to help settle the question of the indiscernability of identicals, making room for the same particular thing sharing all its qualities with another without being one and the same. If there are two white patches in two places which are otherwise identical, one would need at least to differentiate them by their relations to different places; these places cannot be differentiated in a similar way without regress. Moore introduced particulars as those entities which can be different despite being completely similar to one another. Wishing to uphold the feelings of ordinary language, Moore applied the distinction to ordinary things as well. Later, in Some Main Problems of Philosophy, Moore comes to think the particular/universal distinction too simple, as relations and relational properties are too different to be classified together.

Chapter 6 also deals with developments in Whitehead's philosophy. In attempting to understand how mathematical notions are applied in science, Whitehead rejected the division between an "inner" and "outer" world or anything like the Lockean distinction between primary and secondary qualities. Science is applied directly to what is empirically given. In line with this, Whitehead developed an event ontology, and used these events as the material from which to construct such things as points and instants, no longer taken as primitive. On this account, what we ordinarily think of as objects, from tables even to the things of physics such as atoms, turn out to be non-ultimate and built up out of complicated sets of events. Whitehead later introduced what he called "perceptual objects" as entities which relate to various direct sense-objects and provide the basis for recognizing laws of nature involving them. Still, in Whitehead's philosophy at the time, one cannot recognize any clear descendent of the usual substance/attribute distinction, and Whitehead himself proclaimed the notion of predication to be a confused jumble of different notions.

Chapter 7 deals with the views of Stout, who had tutored both Moore and Russell at Cambridge before spending much of his academic career at St. Andrews. Stout endorsed what we would now call a trope theory, or as he put it, particular "characters", or instances of, e.g., redness or squareness. Stout held that what the various characters of redness had in common was an indefinable kind of "distributed unity", and what we think of as characters of one thing had a similar indefinable kind of "concrete unity" amongst them. These unities are not themselves, however, to be thought of as distinct things apart from the members of the categories they define. Stout took issue with, e.g., the Russellian notion that one can be acquainted with a particular itself; one is instead always acquainted only with the characters of a thing. MacBride also discusses Moore's criticisms of Stout's views, including those presented at a 1923 Aristotelian Society symposium, which have been very influential even if (according to MacBride) not always well understood. At the heart of Moore's worry is that it must in some way be possible to make the same claim about one thing that one makes about another. If the red character of A is distinct from the red character of B, then either we predicate different things of A and B in the statements "A is red" and "B is red", or we are instead claiming that A and B each have a character that falls in a certain category of characters Q. Stout was committed even to predications of inclusion in a category involving different category-inclusion characters for different instances, and so even here we do not have the same thing being predicated of both A and B. MacBride concludes that Stout did not have a good solution to this problem compatible with his core commitments.

MacBride returns to Russell's views in Chapter 8, focusing in particular on the development of the multiple relations theory of judgment adopted after Russell abandoned his former view of propositions as mind-independent complexes. The view changed over the years, propelled to a great extent by Russell's puzzling over how the relations we make judgments about enter into the judgment relation, and whether it can account for the direction or sense of relations. One disappointing thing about MacBride's discussion is that he dismisses the importance of Russell's work on mathematical logic and the paradoxes involving propositions as important for understanding Russell's transitioning views during this period. MacBride claims in a footnote (p. 155) that Russell did not invoke the propositional paradoxes when giving reasons for rejecting his former view of propositions. It is true that Russell does not mention the paradoxes in the 1910 paper "On the Nature of Truth and Falsehood", or in the Theory of Knowledge manuscript, but he does mention them in earlier published works such as "Les paradoxes de la Logique" (Russell 2014, 288-96) and the 1906-7 paper "On the Nature of Truth" (Russell 2014, 451). Familiarity with Russell's pre-Principia Mathematica manuscripts such as "On Substitution", "Logic in which Propositions are not Entities", "The Paradox of the Liar", and so on (now published in Russell 2014) make it undeniable that the propositional paradoxes were the main catalyst for Russell's rethinking his views on propositions, even if he more often pointed to worries about, e.g., objective falsehoods, when justifying the views he developed afterwards. Understanding the connection with Russell's formal work is also important for understanding the interplay with Wittgenstein, who explicitly mentioned the failings of Russell's theory of types when outlining his doubts about the multiple relations theory (McGuinness 1995, 38), as well as Russell's reaction. As Ramsey reported to Wittgenstein after the publication of the Tractatus, "Of all your work he seems now to accept only this: that it is nonsense to put an adjective where a substantive ought to be which helps with his theory of types" (McGuinness 1995, 147). Even though MacBride discusses at length different positions on the logical combinatorial possibilities for relations and other universals considered by Russell, he leaves the reader in the dark about the connections between these issues and the formal work, and Principia's type theory in particular.

Nevertheless, despite this, MacBride does a nice job in the chapter summarizing Russell's changes of mind about the metaphysical issues, and the proposed complications made to the theory in the 1913 Theory of Knowledge manuscript. Perhaps the boldest claim is that Russell still held a version of the multiple relations theory in the 1918 Philosophy of Logical Atomism lectures. Russell is usually read there as being undecided about the correct form of a theory of judgment, no longer holding a multiple relations theory but not yet endorsing the more picture-theory-esque account he would go on to endorse in 1919. MacBride reads Russell as endorsing a new "higher-order" version of the theory, whereupon the subordinate relation -- the one the belief or judgment is "about" -- is to be understood as occurring not merely as a relatum of the judgment relation, but as playing a special "higher-order" role. Unfortunately, MacBride does not really make it clear what it would be for a relation to occur as one of the relata of the judgment relation but nonetheless in a "higher-order" way. The position requires that the occurrence of this relation is still a predicative or relating occurrence, even though it is not guaranteed to actually relate the entities it is ascribed to. This seems impossible. MacBride is perhaps right that Russell would have been attracted to such a solution if it could be coherently explained or articulated, but my own reading is that Russell himself was not at this time convinced that this could be done. Because of this, I think it is best not to read him as definitely endorsing a position of this stripe, as MacBride does.

Chapter 9 is devoted to Wittgenstein's picture theory in the Tractatus. On this theory, what represents certain objects being related to each other in a fact is not some sign or name of the relation in a sentence, but rather the names of the objects themselves being related in a certain way in the fact that the propositional sign itself is. MacBride stresses that according to this theory, the feature of ordinary language according to which there must always be a "verb" apparently standing for a different kind of constituent (i.e., a universal), is an accidental feature of language as we find it, and not something pointing to a fundamental divide in reality. All that can be known a priori about propositions representing reality is that they, somehow, represent that "this is how things are", and everything else is discovered. This means that the Kantian project of attempting to deduce a priori what the basic categories involved in judgment must be is a futile one. What impresses me most about MacBride's discussion in this chapter is that he recognizes that Wittgenstein's picture theory did not come out of nowhere, and he connects it both to Frege's views and even to a picture-theory-esque account Russell had explored as early as 1906. Indeed, I think MacBride does not go far enough with regard to the last point, confining himself to Russell's 1906-7 "On the Nature of Truth". In fact, Russell even explored the kind of view MacBride thinks Wittgenstein invented only later, on which it is not the idea of a relation that occurs in a picture of a relational complex, but a relation between the ideas or names. Consider this 1906 passage:

Take "A believes φ(x,y)". We shall say that φ(x,y) is not itself before A's mind at all; but that if we call i'x,i'y the ideas of x and y, i'x and i'y are in A's mind, and have there a relation analogous to φ, which we may call φi. Thus "belief in φ(x,y) exists" is "φi(i'x,i'y)", i.e. "the ideas of x and y are in fact related in the way (φi) corresponding to the relation φ between x and y". In this way we can explain belief in false propositions without supposing that there are any propositions. (Russell 2014, 185)

This is clearly closer to the view Wittgenstein went on to develop than to the view MacBride attributes to earlier Russell.

The final substantive chapter deals with Ramsey and his doubts about the universal/particular distinction. He sketches these doubts as the culmination of the influence of Wittgenstein's skepticism about any a priori account of the nature of atomic facts, Whitehead's views that physical things can be regarded as properties of events, and Ramsey's own working-through of the problem of complex universals. MacBride's primary focus is on Ramsey's paper "Universals", in which he argues against the idea that the things that predicates mean are in any sense "incomplete" or more essential to combination than the things that proper names mean, thereby rejecting this difference as the basis for the distinction between universals and particulars. The appearance of a difference, the suggestion goes, stems from the fact that we tend to regard all statements in which the name "a" occurs as being of a single form "φ(a)", but only regard some statements in which "F" occurs as being of the form "F(x)", excluding, e.g., " (∃y)Fy". But this discrepancy is itself the result of simply not employing more fine-grained representations of possible forms, such as, e.g., "R1(a)", where "R1" is a variable that may only be replaced by a simple monadic predicate. Ramsey thinks ordinary language may enshrine similar asymmetric attitudes towards what different modes of occurrences are tracked, so that the difference between substantives and adjectives ends up entirely dependent on which kinds of common occurrences we bother to distinguish, and which we don't, rather than something grounded in an objective difference in the entities they represent.

The book has a four page "Coda" that confirms what the reader by this point has already come to suspect: much of MacBride's agenda with the book is to establish that the distinction between universal and particular, although still widespread, should not be seen as inevitable or beyond the reach of reasonable doubt. Even the very figures who founded the tradition developed several viable positions that do not make the distinction, or take it to be fundamental. In the end, MacBride seems most sympathetic to the positions of early Wittgenstein and Ramsey, who he reads as adopting a position according to which no one kind of constituent in a fact is especially responsible for determining its logical form. He finishes with the thought that:

We should open our minds to the possibility that unity and structure arises from the mutual interaction of several things and allow nature to disclose whether these things belong to one or more kinds. (237)

MacBride of course does not present himself or these philosophers as having settled the issue, but even his own more tentative conclusion seems premature. In the case of Wittgenstein, he seems to have simply transitioned from thinking of properties and relations as constituents to focusing on them as elements of the form of a fact. The form would determine how many constituents it would or could have, and their possible natures, even if it is not itself to be thought of as a constituent. I think this is perhaps what he was gesturing at in an early letter to Russell when he wrote that "I now think that Qualities, Relations (like Love), are all copulae" (McGuinness 1995, 38). The question then becomes whether or not forms themselves are entities at all, even if they are not typically constituents of the facts whose forms they are. If we answer "yes," then we get a position which Russell explored as early as 1904 (see Russell 1994, 98), and we do have a different "kind" of thing. In Ramsey's case, we can accept that he asks a very good question: Is the difference between substantives and adjectives merely a difference in which fine-grained distinctions in form we bother to make? But MacBride does not (nor Ramsey, to my knowledge) consider whether or not that difference in attitude might itself be a reflection of some other real difference in the metaphysical nature of the meanings. Perhaps some objective difference explains why we have this difference in attitude. Of course, the burden would be on the defender of the distinction to suss out and articulate what that difference is, and how it affects our cognition.

MacBride succeeds admirably in his main goal, however, of reinvigorating the debates by laying out some of the many presuppositions and directions of thought that continue to shape the way these issues are discussed and presented today. MacBride identifies several "roads not taken", or at least roads that were only traversed partly and might be worthy of taking a bit further than they have been so far. He also makes plain how richly complex and intricate the arguments and complexities surrounding the issue can be. And he is able to do so by looking at a fairly narrow historical context. The book focuses entirely on what is about a 30-year period, from the late 1890s to late 1920s, and every figure to which he devotes significant space -- Moore, Russell, Whitehead, Stout, Wittgenstein and Ramsey -- is not only a man working in the British tradition, but someone with a close connection to Cambridge University. These facts unfortunately show that the book's advertising pitch is guilty of exaggeration. Both the book's dust jacket and its introduction profess an aim to remedy our reliance on "too narrow a base of historical evidence" (vii), and to reacquaint us with figures and positions lost to history. I'm not sure it really succeeds in doing that; of the figures mentioned, only Stout can with real justice be claimed to be a neglected figure, and his views are given the least space and come across least well in the book.

The debate over universals and particulars is ubiquitous in philosophy: one can likely find rich discussions of it at almost any time in history, at almost any place on the globe, where philosophy was actively pursued at all. One can certainly agree that broadening the focus of historical studies on this and other issues in philosophy is a worthwhile goal. But MacBride's less-than-fully-successful attempt to broaden things underscores how daunting that task is. Even with its narrow focus, one gets the feeling that there was more to say. Certainly, there are whole lines of development in Russell's, and Moore's, and Wittgenstein's, thought, and lines of influence on them, that are not explored here. If a book of this length must necessarily leave things out even with its narrow focus, a study of similar depth that was truly broad in scope seems almost impossible, at least without sacrificing the kinds of rich detail a study such as this one has. So MacBride cannot really be faulted. Let us hope that, with time, studies of other periods and thinkers can receive a treatment as rich as MacBride's.


McGuinness, B. F., ed. (1995). Wittgenstein in Cambridge: Letters and Documents 1911-1951. Blackwell.

Russell, Bertrand (1994). The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, vol. 4, Foundations of Logic, 1903-1905, A. Urquhart (ed.). Routledge.

Russell, Bertrand (2014). The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, vol. 5, Towards Principia Mathematica 1905-08, G. H. Moore (ed.). Routledge.