On the Happiness of the Philosophic Life: Reflections on Rousseau's Rêveries

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Heinrich Meier, On the Happiness of the Philosophic Life: Reflections on Rousseau's Rêveries, Robert Berman (tr.), University of Chicago Press, 2016, 344pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226074030.

Reviewed by Ryan Patrick Hanley, Marquette University


The Rousseau best known to philosophers today is largely the Rousseau of the Social Contract, and to a lesser extent, of the Discourse on Inequality -- that is to say, a Rousseau committed to equality, civic unity, and freedom. The Rousseau on which Heinrich Meier's book focuses is a very different one. His is the Rousseau of the Reveries of the Solitary Walker, and to a lesser extent, of the Dialogues -- that is to say, a Rousseau in search of solitude and the "philosophic life." To this end, Meier's book offers a close reading of the Reveries, a work whose "alpha and omega is solitude" (3).

Meier's book is divided into two parts. The longer first part focuses on the Reveries, and aims "to think the philosophic life with constant regard to Rousseau's least understood book" (ix). The shorter second part provides a close reading of the "Creed of the Savoyard Vicar" of Rousseau's Emile, arguing that it "tries to lay the ground for a successful nonphilosophic life" (ix). The first part is divided into seven chapters, each of which largely focuses on one or two chapters (or as Rousseau calls them, "Promenades") of the Reveries. Its first chapter, "The Philosopher among Nonphilosophers," examines the rhetoric and methods of the literary presentation of the Reveries, "the writing in which Rousseau discloses the principles of his philosophy with the greatest boldness during his lifetime" and "his most rhetorical writing" (9). Here it is argued that we do well to read the Reveries next to the Dialogues and the first Discourse insofar as their shared "grand theme" is "the philosopher among nonphilosophers or the question concerning the rhetoric needed by philosophy" (44). Chapter Two, "Faith," introduces another primary theme of Meier's book, the relationship of the religious life to the philosophical life. On this front Meier's main claim is that philosophy is "radical" and "does not content itself with any answer that owes its authentication to an authority" (54), and hence "the philosophic life is utterly incompatible with the life of obedience of faith" (56). This leads him to conclude that beneath a surface teaching meant for "Everyman" which values hope and faith, a "critique of faith in revelation" yet lies in the "background" (56) -- a critique that is "nothing less than an attack on the center of faith in revelation, on the sovereignty of God" (66).

Chapter Three, "Nature," focuses on the seventh promenade. It examines "the eros of the philosopher" who experiences the "joys that belong intrinsically to contemplation" (94) chiefly with reference to the ways in which Rousseau himself studied nature. Botany is said to have provided Rousseau both with contemplative delights "not accessible to Everyman" (86) and a vehicle for his cultivation of "an attitude diametrically opposed to the enterprise of modern science," which studies nature not to "conquer" it but "to find new reasons to love it" (87). Chapter Four, the central chapter of the first book, focuses on the fifth promenade, telling the story of Rousseau's sojourn on his island in the middle of the Lac de Bienne. It presents Rousseau's "need to close himself off, to withdraw, to turn inward to himself" (100) via a helpful exploration of the concept of Beisichselbstsein, which the translator has wisely chosen to leave untranslated (see xv). In emphasizing the degree to which Rousseau was animated by this "love for being closed off" (117) Meier presents the author of the Reveries not merely as a hermit, but as one who lived an existence that was hermetically sealed, and which enabled him to "enjoy those 'compensations' to which not Everyman has access" (130). Chapter Five comes back down to "Politics," beginning with three sentences that start with "persecution" (135). Focusing on the sixth promenade, it aims to show the incompatibility of Rousseau's life with political life. Rousseau "was never fully suited for civil society or political community" (135), we are told, and "not made to achieve felicity in the political life" (166). This, it is suggested, was the result of the incommensurability of "his natural independence and his natural orientation" (138) with notions of duty or obligation to others. The solitary walker was "not made for obedience" (140) because his "independence" requires following his "inclination" (144) -- the obverse of course of the lesson Jean-Jacques sought to teach Emile, and which in part drew Kant to Rousseau.

Chapter Six turns to "Love," and connects Rousseau's experience of love to his philosophical eros. To this end, Meier interprets Rousseau's affair with Madame de Warens as part of his Beisichselbstsein (181) on the grounds that it served as "a kind of second birth" (185) in which "philosophic eros provides entrée into the 'ideal world'" (194). Chapter Seven returns to "Self-knowledge," earlier called "the question that preoccupies Rousseau from the first step of the first promenade onward" (46). The issue here emerges directly from the eros examined in the previous chapter: that in "striving to incorporate the whole, in its inclination to expand itself to the whole," the soul animated by eros "all too easily loses sight of itself" (207). Self-knowledge tempers erotic out-going and provides "the basis for his confidence that he is able repeatedly to return to himself and to be bei sich" (220).

Part Two turns from the Reveries to the "Creed of the Savoyard Vicar." It aims to show that the task of the Vicar's profession of faith "is to make vivid in an exemplary way how an homme vulgaire can be instructed in matters of religion, in accord with reason, corresponding to his nature, and taking into account historical circumstances" (223). Meier values the creed for the degree to which it "artfully lays bare the presuppositions on which the faith of moral man necessarily rests" (223). In part these presuppositions consist in a rejection of the foundations of the life of the philosopher: the vicar believes "that the belief that provides the basis for the philosophic life, or the knowledge that the philosopher alleges as the foundation, does not suffice to be able to lead a good life" (240). The Vicar's life, however, is even more indefensible, we are told: "he does not know what is important to know, but rather he believes it" (250). This culminates in the insistence that "the profession of faith of the Savoyard Vicar stands in service to a life that presents a stark contrast to the philosophic life" -- two lives that "relate to one another as figure and ground in a gestalt illusion" (319).

As will be clear from this summary, Meier's book is consistently animated by a binary distinction between "philosophers" and "nonphilosophers." This is a theme some political philosophers will know from the thought of Leo Strauss. Meier's own previous work focused on Strauss (as well as Carl Schmitt and Nietzsche), and thus it is hardly accidental that many themes familiar from Strauss are central to his interpretation of Rousseau. In addition to the notion that "the distinction between philosophers and nonphilosophers is insuperable because men are by nature unequal" (5; cf. 91), Meier emphasizes Rousseau's use of "deliberately employed rhetoric" in the service of "addressing unequal addressees given different things to understand" (4). This leads him to present Rousseau as "the master of indirect communication, of roundabout conformation, of cryptic corroboration" (10), and to present the Reveries as an exemplar of the "art of exoteric-esoteric writing" (190) written by one who knows that "the truth is dangerous" (5), and seeks to be "as harmless as possible" to those limited to "the Everyman perspective" (104). In this vein, the other omnipresent binary in Meier's interpretation, beyond the distinction of those who lead "an Everyman's existence" from those who lead "an exceptional existence" (11), is that between the "attentive reader" and the "unintelligent reader" (6), or the "ideal reader" and the "ordinary reader" (27).

So what then does the "attentive reader" see that the "unintelligent reader" misses? And how exactly do their methods of reading differ? Meier claims that the former is one "who knows how to think the oeuvre in its inner structure and knows how to understand the oeuvre from its underlying intention" (188), and who will be ready "to engage wholly with the movement of thought that underlies the exoteric-esoteric presentation" (190). In practice this is said to take the form of patiently and painstakingly ferreting out "the clues that indicate to the careful reader that he is on the right track" (10). Meier himself gives examples of this throughout the text. Take for example his analysis of Rousseau's references to God:

Whereas Dieu does not occur in either the Troisième or the Quatrième promenade, Rousseau employs the term in four places before and after the pair of promenades. Stated more precisely, he uses Dieu five times altogether, in one passage in the first, second, fifth, and sixth walks, respectively. If we look up the four places in the four walks symmetrically flanking the two promenades in which the term is omitted, and follow the paths that link them with one another, the eccentric topography of the Rêveries exposes the view of the center of Rousseau's critique of faith in revelation. (63)

Some are likely to find this method of analysis persuasive. Others may regret that Meier's book lacks a defense of this method capable of alleviating possible concerns that the text is being read though the lens of certain preconceptions regarding its "underlying intention."

Other concerns also present themselves. It is to be regretted that Meier has not engaged more directly and explicitly with the extensive scholarship on Rousseau that now exists in three languages. Strauss and Nietzsche are cited several times in the notes but references to contemporary scholarship are relatively few. And in light of his insistence that the Vicar does not speak for Rousseau (224) -- itself a much-debated point among scholars -- it is also to be regretted that Meier does not more extensively discuss how certain claims of the Vicar's map on to certain claims that Rousseau elsewhere presents in Emile, including his discussions of bearing necessity's yoke (209), the role of the epistemic faculties of sensation, comparison and judgment (244), and the superiority of judgments of the heart (268). Further, while Meier marvels at Rousseau's "boldness" (9) and "radical questioning" (54), it's hard to shake the sense that critique of revelation, however radical it may have been in 1778, is simply part and parcel of our -- to use Charles Taylor's phrase -- secular age. To be truly radical today it would seem one would need rather to take up the Vicar's own challenge to "'dare to acknowledge God among the philosophers'" (322).

Meier's study is most valuable for its articulation of Beisichselbstsein -- a very fruitful concept of great use for readers not merely of the Reveries but of Rousseau's broader corpus. Yet the cost of entry to this analysis is an openness to this study's other foundational concepts, including especially the distinctions between the few and the many, between exoteric and esoteric writing, and between the religious life and the philosophical life. Those who have come to embrace these distinctions via the thought of Strauss are likely to find this work very exciting. Those seeking to better understand Rousseau the philosopher of equality, of civic unity, of virtue, and of freedom, are likely to find this book disappointing.