On the Human Condition

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Dominique Janicaud, On the Human Condition, trans. Eileen Brennan, Introduction by Simon Critchley, Routledge, 2005, 71 pp., $15.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415327962.

Reviewed by Vicki Kirby, University of New South Wales


Dominique Janicaud's work began to appear in English translation just over a decade ago, and this slim volume in the Routledge Thinking in Action series provides a useful introduction to its contemporary relevance. The philosopher, who died in August 2002, was absorbed with questions about humanism and its discontents, especially the nature of rationality and attendant concerns about community and ethics. Heavily influenced by both Hegel and Heidegger, and with an informed interest in scientific research, it is not surprising that his contribution has broad significance for both the French and German philosophical traditions and for Anglo-American philosophy of science. Simon Critchley sets the scene for the uninitiated in an extended introduction, emphasizing that "the overwhelming critical intention of Janicaud's work is to leave behind all fantasies of overcoming, whether that concerns an overcoming of metaphysics, of rationality, or humanity as such" (p. vii). This means that for Janicaud, the political and ethical consequence of technological change doesn't automatically herald the displacement or transcendence of the human condition. Instead, the assessment of innovations such as human cloning, genetic engineering, the promise of the "enfant à la carte" or machine intelligence can only be made by returning to some notion of the human. After all, what is it that will be threatened or enhanced? Perhaps the point for Janicaud is that the human condition is a question to be explored rather than a set of attributions to be assumed.

However, one could be forgiven for thinking that Janicaud's own prefatory remarks about human fragility, remarks that seem to endorse an apocalyptic vision of foreboding, are strangely premature if the very definition of human identity is under consideration. In other words, what is it that secures Janicaud's judgment that something may well be lost, or at least diminished, if it isn't the reference point of an uninterrogated human identity? We will need to return to this question of initial conditions as it underpins Janicaud's thesis and its evaluation. Suffice it at this stage to note that the philosopher is intent on reminding us that the special status accorded human identity has been subverted.

This subversion relates first to knowledge of the origins of man and his point of attachment to the chain of beings: neither his genetic code, nor the use of tools, nor a certain language, nor social codes differentiate him in an absolute manner. (p. 1)

Indeed, the future may represent an even more radical assault if "biotechnological mutations were to transform 'the human race' to the point of rendering it unrecognizable, biologically, technically, culturally" (p. 1). Janicaud adds to this picture of human dismemberment with what he describes as "the most serious subversion," namely, the threat to man's psychological equilibrium and his perceived capacity to control his destiny and take responsibility for his actions and their outcome.

Although Janicaud doesn't entirely deny this rather bleak possibility of annihilation, he does offer a more optimistic way forward that questions its inevitability. In the first of four little essays, "Is Humanism the Last Resort?" Janicaud returns to Heidegger's critique of Sartre to rescue certain aspects of humanism. First, he reminds us that Sartre's assumption that "man is what he makes of himself" (p. 9) allows no recourse to the Divine, no recourse to a final solution nor appeal to a fixed origin. Man is a work in progress in Sartre's account, "all the time outside of himself: it is in projecting and losing himself beyond himself that he makes man … exist" (p. 8). But if Janicaud and Heidegger might agree with Sartre's dissolution of a human essence they part company with him when he attributes the cause of human transformation to human subjectivity. Heidegger's objection is that by making Man the creator of his own existence Sartre doesn't fully acknowledge a much larger question about the existence of the world and the nature of all Being. Janicaud underlines the importance of Heidegger's intervention in the form of a moral admonition:

man must not revel either in the inventory of his 'qualities' nor in his achievements … he has to reposition his being in relation to what caused him to emerge in the world and in relation to the life that supports him and whose sense he bears. (p. 11)

Despite this criticism, Janicaud seems more interested in refining our understanding of humanism than abandoning its terms altogether, even though he reminds us of Michel Foucault's enigmatic promise of "the death of man" in The Order of Things and Claude Lévi-Strauss' claim in The Savage Mind that "the ultimate goal of the human sciences … [is] not to constitute, but to dissolve man" (p. 13). Janicaud raises these well-known aphorisms in order to caution those who interpret them as a rejection of humanism, for although the sovereign identity of Man can't be defended, broader questions about technological futures, the redefinition of life and our ethical responsibility for the choices we make remain bound to an enduring battery of humanist commitments. As Janicaud notes, "[w]hen all is said and done we debate and struggle over the limits of humanism on behalf of man, for an opening up of his horizon and for a liberation of his possibilities" (p. 17).

In "The Danger of Monsters" we gain a better sense of why Janicaud remains wedded to humanism, and why there might be problems with his particular version of humanism's irreducibility. First of all, it is patently clear from these little meditations that Janicaud is wary of technology's ability to manipulate life. He sees in the Promethean dream of a scientific instrumentalism a desire to control and dominate Nature and to transcend human imperfection and finitude. Indeed, this unwelcome possibility is even heralded in a specific example: "the overcoming of the human by a Successor without face or body, but infinitely more intelligent and robust than us" (p. 27). Janicaud certainly concedes that life and intelligence could assume a silicon form, "a vast bank of self-programmed data, without any anchorage in flesh and blood" (p. 29). However, his point seems to be that even this "totally inhuman" operation that can overcome "the limits and moorings that made man's 'humus'" (p. 29) must remain tethered to its human creator. If there is, indeed, an inseparable and ironic relationship between the human condition and the power of technology to completely transform that condition, then the ethical responsibility for technology's threat and its promise remains with Man.

However inhuman the universe produced by technology is, it still refers to the human, which is its source, uniquely capable of using it and giving it meaning. That which endangers humanity, then, really derives from itself: a freedom that turns against itself. (p. 34)

This theme of threat, of "evil, always latent, always ready to spoil our achievements irreparably" (p. 34), is further elaborated in "From Foreseeable Risks to the Unforeseeable" and "Between the Superhuman and the Inhuman." Janicaud is concerned that Man may well be in the process of unleashing the very forces that will lead to his demise, despite his intentions to do otherwise. "More than a philosophical idea, it is an intuition that becomes clear: man is in the process of liberating cosmic energies of which he is less and less the master" (p. 43). However, Janicaud's point, reiterated in each of the essays, is that we should not conceive humanism in opposition to the base animality of the inhuman -- the sub-human -- nor in opposition to the technological transformations and promises of the superhuman. Indeed, he even confounds the difference between these "two unfathomable extremes of our condition" (p. 53), which in turn vitiates against a complacent understanding of what comprises the human. Given this, perhaps we can take the energy and apprehension in Janicaud's meditation to refine its terms and maintain its direction.

We will recall that Sartre's version of humanism was rejected because it assumed that Man was the source of his own being, the self-referential consciousness that enabled his evolution (for good or bad). Although the statement "Man is what he makes of himself" acknowledges the inherent instability of identity, the assumption that the engine of this "making," this constitution, is consciousness is misguided. Even if we were to concede that consciousness (agency, choice, responsibility) is a straightforward property or capacity and we were all in agreement about its identity, how it comes into being and is maintained by "something" that presumably doesn't possess its complexity, its technicity, is the puzzle of the human condition. Unfortunately, when Janicaud separates the body from consciousness, what is purportedly "unfathomable" in the human condition is identified as consciousness and defined against corporeal life. And by doing this, Janicaud recuperates the reductionism in Sartre's "Man is what he makes of himself" by excluding any reference to the brute and material being of the human condition and the world around us. Ironically, it was this sort of pre-emptive containment of the question of consciousness, and Being more generally, that Janicaud warned against.

What happens if we cast Janicaud's question about the nature of the human condition in its broadest possible terms, and in a way that interrogates the many divisions that conventionally locate this identity rather than presuming their reliability? For example, if we argue that "Nature is what it makes of itself" we acknowledge the internal instability, the reflexivity, in Sartre's statement about the human condition, and yet here, complexity, technicity, language and consciousness are originary. What is at stake in this suggestion that Man is Nature? The natural capacity of the human to effect change and incorporate the results captures something important in Janicaud's argument, something that in this expanded and yet more problematic sense of agency and incorporation refuses to segregate origin from end, Nature from Culture, or consciousness from a body that (thoughtlessly) subtends and precedes it. Indeed, it underlines that our involvement with each other and with the world around us is more profoundly entangled than we conventionally concede.

In sum, Janicaud is right to insist that humanism endures, even in those discourses that pretend to abandon it. Because if all our attempts to comprehend, transform or transcend the human condition remain wedded to its enigma, then how we represent this enigma will prove central to debates about ethical and political possibilities. To presume that technology is a human invention and responsibility in a way that ignores the technological intelligence of Nature within which the human condition arises forecloses the very questions that Janicaud wants to consider. And to fail to concede this enlarged scene of genesis and technicity will divide simplicity and innocence (Nature) from corruption (human Culture) and enable a moralism incapable of interrogating the complicity of its terms of reference. Janicaud's project certainly helps us appreciate why the question of the human condition is so difficult to pose and why the enigma of identity formation cannot be circumscribed. Indeed, it may well be that Janicaud's inability to sustain the enigma is not so much an error as it is a constitutive and compelling component of the enigma, a paradox whose "unfathomable" dimensions demand further inquiry.