On the Intrinsic Value of Everything

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Scott A. Davison, On the Intrinsic Value of Everything, Continuum, 2012, 150pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441147455.

Reviewed by Toni Rønnow-Rasmussen, Lund University, Sweden


The title in combination with the slim size shouldn't fool you. Davison's book is an ambitious and insightful work, in which the author has set himself the tough challenge of arguing for what he rightly realizes will strike many as a highly implausible view, viz. that everything is intrinsically valuable. The style is clear, the conclusions tightly argued, and being extremely well organized, it is, despite the complexity of many of the issues discussed, easy reading.

At the outset Davison declares that he adheres to a version of Scanlon's much discussed buck-passing account of value. He recasts it as follows: "being intrinsically valuable is a matter of having intrinsically natural properties that would give any fully informed, properly functioning valuer good reasons to value something for its own sake." However, it should be pointed out that Davison's focus is not really on the pros and cons of this sort of analysis. Readers who expect to find, for instance, a detailed discussion of the more serious problems that have haunted buck-passers and Fitting-attitude analysts in recent years will therefore most likely be disappointed.[1] Nor is he trying to convince us that his way of understanding the concept of intrinsic value is better than all other rival conceptions.

Davison sets out from the familiar (Moorean) idea that what determines whether something is an intrinsic value or not is whether the value accrues to the value bearer's intrinsic features. Something is an intrinsic value if and only if it is good in itself, i.e. good independently of its external relational properties. He dismisses without much ado recent ideas by, for example, Shelly Kagan, that there is an equally fundamental value accruing to objects in virtue of a relation between the object and something else. Davison also believes that intrinsic value admits of degrees; it is not an all-or-nothing affair. This idea plays a key role in the book. His aim is therefore not to show that everything has the same amount of intrinsic value but rather to argue that everything has intrinsic value to some degree. In fact, he qualifies this at an early stage. Although he argues that everything existing is intrinsically valuable to some degree, his primary aim in the book is less encompassing. The conclusion Davison really wants us to arrive at is that every "concrete" entity carries intrinsic value to some degree. So although he would say that each of the billion raindrops that are falling to the ground this very moment has intrinsic value to some degree, he argues that it has a lower degree of intrinsic value than, for instance, my neighbor's dog, and the dog has a lesser degree of intrinsic value than you and I, and everything has intrinsic value to a lesser degree than God. This is, then, what Davison eventually wants us to believe. I find the view he defends quite hard to embrace. But I have to hand it to Davison: he does put up a good fight for his view.

In the course of his main argument, Davison identifies a number of key questions. Thus, beside the issue of whether intrinsic value is an all-or-nothing affair -- which he refers to as the Degree Question -- he explores what he takes to be the interesting logical possible answers to what he calls the Distribution Question: how much intrinsic value is there in the world? He recognizes that he cannot conclusively dismiss the idea that there is nothing of intrinsic value, which he takes to be the main alternative to his own view. Also, he admits that he is not able to demonstrate in a noncircular way that any concrete (or abstract) object is intrinsically valuable to some degree. His account will nonetheless still be attractive, he thinks, because it is theoretically simple, and it concurs with some "natural" widespread beliefs about the value of human beings. Two more questions play important roles in his book. There is the Cutoff Question: "if some kinds of things are intrinsically valuable and others are not, then where is the cutoff point between them?" (p. 27); and the Explanation Question: "what explains why a given intrinsically valuable thing is intrinsically valuable?" (p. 27).

As we have seen, Davison is attracted to the idea that intrinsic value comes in degrees. In addition, he also convincingly argues that the degree of intrinsic value need not accrue essentially to its value bearer. En passant, it might be thought that the buck-passing account lends itself to the view that goodness in itself is not an all-or-nothing notion. However, nothing in Davison's buck-passing analysis definitively reflects that it analyses a degree of value rather than an all-or-nothing value. It would have been interesting to hear more about how exactly "degree" translates into buck-passing terms.

Davison puts forward several arguments in favor of his main conclusion that all concrete particulars are intrinsically valuable. In fact, he defends the even more encompassing claim that there are entities which exemplify any ontological category that carries intrinsic value to some degree. Although he is quite cautious when it comes to this more speculative outlook, the impression he gives is that he is ready to embrace something even more encompassing; that there is something about any object from whatever ontological category we consider that would provide the fully informed, properly functioning valuer with good reasons to value it for its own sake. In this connection, Davison discusses in detail the rival positions of leading value theorists such as Ben Bradley, Noah Lemos, and Michael J. Zimmerman. Each of them accepts value bearer monism, holding that only one kind of metaphysical entity carries intrinsic value. But they have different views of what it is that bears intrinsic value.  In contrast, Davison advocates value bearer pluralism: concrete as well as abstract entities are bearers of value. Monists fail to convince him. Despite the fact that the pluralist approach complicates matters considerably, I myself find it attractive, and although I did not find all of his arguments against the monists equally convincing, I am inclined to subscribe to the general idea that any kind of value bearer monism misses important bearers of value.

As to the Cutoff Question (see above), Davison argues that we should not expect to find any plausible nonarbitrary answer to why certain things are intrinsically valuable and others are not. In addition, he presents some positive considerations and hypothetical thought experiments for his main conclusion (that every concrete object is intrinsically valuable to some degree). One of these considerations in particular will, I suspect, grab people's attention: his Annihilation Test. The idea is quite simple. Suppose we had a machine that completely annihilated any object that was put inside it. Davison applies such a machine to show that we do have reason to think that, for example, children have intrinsic value to some degree. Thus, imagine that your children end up in such a machine. Davison regards his children as having intrinsic value. In fact, he thinks we share a "natural belief about the intrinsic value of children." But he carefully points out that he has no noncircular argument in favor of its truth. This is, then, where the test comes in. Would a fully informed, properly functioning valuer regard the annihilation of a child as a significant loss? Davison firmly believes so.

But I am more puzzled than convinced. First, there is a general problem with the Annihilation Test. As far as I understand it, this test cannot be employed as a way of determining our intuitions about the intrinsic value of what is being annihilated. As a test it can only help us examine our intuitions about what is valuable on the whole. The reason is that an annihilation of the bearer of value will also annihilate its effects, what it is good for, etc. Second, the example in question is not an obvious one. Being a child is at least more plausibly regarded as a relational feature than an intrinsic property. A duplicate (to use Davison's own way of explicating the difference between internal and relational features) of my child would not be my or -- for that matter -- anyone's child. So we should be cautious about whatever intuitive strength we extract from the fact that there are children involved. But perhaps I am mistaken about this. It might be that Davison has an intrinsic feature in mind; might he be thinking of, say the value of an immature human person?[2]

Now, Davison goes to great lengths to explain why we should think that different things are intrinsically valuable to different degrees. Why, for instance, does a microorganism possess intrinsic value to a higher degree than a raindrop or a lump of coal? Davison has several suggestions. We can detect a sort of pattern in our evaluations of concrete objects. The more complicated the intrinsic structure, the higher the degree of intrinsic value. A related idea has to do with the dispositional structure of the concrete objects; if it allows the entity to interact with other things to a greater extent than something else, we are likely to find the former more intrinsically valuable. Sometimes the idea has a certain Aristotelian ring to it; if things work "properly" they have more intrinsic value than things that malfunction.

As explanations of why people tend to value things differently, Davison might have a point. However, it is not really a very strong one. For instance, I strongly suspect that many people would not value an elaborate method of torture more highly than a simple one. People would, if anything, take elaborate torture (with its more complicated structure) to be more evil than simple torture. I suspect that Davison would agree with this. In one place, he at least points out that complexity alone does not make something intrinsically better than something less complex. But whether or not these considerations more or less correspond to people's actual evaluations, I find them not at all convincing qua good reasons. My intuitions deviate perhaps most clearly from Davison's when it comes to his fundamental idea that anything that has an intrinsic structure has intrinsic value to some degree. Why would we endorse such a general evaluation? As far as I can see, Davison's basic answer is that, regardless of the nature of the intrinsic structure, a fully informed, properly functioning valuer will find the structure itself to provide reasons for valuing it for its own sake. Ultimately, such a valuer will prefer for its own sake the existence of anything to its non-existence. Davison sticks to this startling claim even when it comes to objects many would consider to be downright bad.

In effect, Davison adheres to two views concerning the possibility of something being bad in itself, that should not be confused. First, he defends the medieval idea that no concrete particular things are intrinsically bad on the whole; things always possess enough good features to outweigh any bad features. I do not share this enthusiastic view about life (and not only because I think there are things that are bad on the whole; there are also things that are value-neutral). The second idea which he seems to endorse, albeit with hesitation, is perhaps even more alien to my own evaluative outlook. For reasons that I do not fully understand, Davison seems to think by implication that an actual concrete state of suffering (to let the discussion come to a head)[3] would be valued for its own sake by a fully informed properly functioning valuer. He holds the possibility open when it comes to pain that it will have good- as well as bad-making features, and that on the whole we might have reasons to avoid or prevent such states. But, importantly, although Davison seems to at least allow that suffering on the whole might be good or bad, as well as good or bad for the person involved, he does not want to say that pain or perhaps even suffering is bad in itself. At one point, in discussing concrete particulars, he states that "annihilating a virus or a portion of poison would result in a loss of intrinsic value, however small; after all, anything is better than nothing" (p. 87). As far as I understand him, he would employ the same "anything is better than nothing" approach to intrinsic structures of a particular person's concrete state of pain. Concrete states are entities with intrinsic structures, and are therefore good in themselves to some degree. The fact that the structure is located in someone's pain is not obviously an exception to this idea. That is for sure a provocative axiology.

I have voiced some objections concerning some of Davison's arguments and conclusions. His book invites this sort of reaction because of the sort of counter-intuitive position he is defending. But there is more to this book than I have been able to focus on here. In fact, it is rich in stirring arguments that ought to engage readers interested in value theory. I should also point out that the two final chapters are less directly concerned with Davison's argument for his main conclusion. Chapter 6 concentrates on the ethical implications of the main conclusion. I found much of interest in this chapter, and I certainly agree in his modest conclusion that the intrinsic value of things ought to play a role in our ethical lives. Finally, Chapter 7 turns to the question of how we should understand the idea that God is the source of goodness and truth, and will perhaps particularly catch the attention of theists.

Davison succeeds in putting a strangely neglected issue on the axiologist's agenda -- it is no longer enough to argue that some things are valuable; now we definitely ought to have a view about why not all the rest is valuable.

[1] Somewhat surprisingly, there is no mention of what many believe is a serious problem with this sort of analysis, i.e. the so-called Wrong Kind of Reason problem.

[2] Contrary to Davison, I would think it is nonetheless plausible to envision that we could favor these human beings for their own sake in virtue of their being children (i.e. in virtue of a relational feature). However, the value involved in such a case is not an intrinsic value.

[3] Davison discusses pain and not suffering. However, in my view, suffering makes for a tougher test case.