On the Public

Placeholder book cover

Alastair Hannay, On the Public, Routledge, 2005, 145pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 041532792X.

Reviewed by Jan-Werner Müller, Princeton University


It's a nice ironic touch that Alastair Hannay's small book On the Public appears in a collection which claims to be a 'major new series that takes philosophy to its public'. While explicitly addressing their publications to 'anyone who wants to think seriously about major issues confronting us today', the series editors appear to assume that this is precisely not everyone. So philosophy either creates or perhaps already has 'its public' or perhaps just 'a public', which, it seems, is different from a mere addition of individual readers. It must be defined by something else, something 'public' beyond mere private reading -- but what? So the confused or at least sloppy language of the editors does inadvertently give credence to the argument that there is indeed a problem here to be philosophically investigated.

This is not a timeless philosophical problem, however. Hannay suggests that the public does not just have its problems these days, but that it has itself become a particular problem for our time. He does not hide the fact that his book was motivated by a relatively recent personal (but in a sense also public) concern: the way the Iraq War was 'sold' to 'the public' in the US and the UK. On a month-long visit to the US, Hannay tells us, he began asking himself questions that he thinks might be typical for a thinker who is in many ways a newcomer to political philosophy: is a divided public still a public, or in fact two publics? What actually is the difference between 'the public' and 'a public'? Is the public some kind of thing, and if not, what is it? Could it be true that, as Raymond Geuss asserted a few years ago, 'there is no such thing as the public/private distinction, or, at any rate, it is a deep mistake to think that there is a single substantive distinction here that can be made to do any real philosophical or political work'? What, if anything, does it mean to be a 'member of the public', or to 'belong' to it? Finally -- and this clearly is the normative core concern of the book -- what is the public's relation to democracy as early-twentieth century citizens of the West tend to conceive it?

Hannay's answers to these questions start with a long detour through the past. He argues that he needs to 'bounce our topic and its subtopics back from their past' in order to get a clearer view of them. So he goes back to ancient Rome, picks up the story again in the eighteenth century, when the idea of a public sphere arose, revisits the famous debate between John Dewey and Walter Lippmann, then finally bounces back into the present and finishes with some unashamedly normative points. He doesn't use the word, but, at least partly, he seems to be after some kind of genealogy.

We might expect then what is often associated with analyses, narratives or indeed genealogies of the public: a story of decline and fall, or heavy doses of Kulturpessimismus and Zivilisationskritik in various mixtures: think of Jürgen Habermas's classic Structural Transformation of the Public Sphere; Sennett's Fall of Public Man; Lippmann's Phantom Public; Hannah Arendt's idealization of the glaring light of the Greek polis, in which men could still shine in the gaze of others and be heroes through public words and deeds, before the 'rise of the social' came to destroy an authentic political realm; and, lastly, Heidegger's contempt for the They, or das Man. Of course, these accounts differ enormously in their method (social scientific, phenomenological, etc.), and in their normative starting points. But most of them come to the conclusion that we are somehow deprived institutionally without a properly working public sphere and therefore also diminished as individuals and as citizens. Hannay's account is no exception to this decline-and-fall literature.

His genealogy serves mostly to demonstrate that notions of the public -- or concepts surrounding 'the public', such as 'public opinion' and 'public sphere' -- were originally political, and, for the most part, normatively charged. In Roman times, as Hannay helpfully reminds us, the 'public' did not refer to 'the people' (conceived of at that time as a sectional interest) but -- understood as res publica -- was almost its direct opposite. The 'public sphere', he explains, was from the beginning a normative concept; and 'public opinion' was from the start, when Voltaire invented it more or less single-handedly, a political notion -- or, more specifically, 'a set of dispositions to feel strongly about some topic that is brought to one's attention'.

As Hannay himself puts it charmingly and disarmingly: this book contains 'nothing new', certainly as far as the whirlwind tour through the history of ideas about the public is concerned. So the burden of philosophical innovation falls squarely on the present-day diagnosis of what has become of the public and what its problems might be. It's not clear, however, whether there's much here either that's terribly new. Hannay claims that Western men and women have become 'addicted to their privacy', and, in any case, have in their role as citizens at best a 'watching brief', rather than any genuine opportunities to participate in public life. The public has effectively been turned into a 'playground', to which we can escape from our privacy to gain some pleasure or other; but it's not a site of sustained civic attention, let alone any kind of collective self-expression. All enfranchised, we are nevertheless all outsiders, and we can't even conceive what real political participation would mean these days. The alienation of the moderns is complete, we might say, and we're lovin' it. Or, as Hannay puts it: 'Instead of the citizen having an investment, the citizen is an investment, an investment handled by the economic powers that determine the safe future of the state, which in turn pampers and protects those privacies upon whose consumerist possibilities and habits its sponsors depend'.

Moreover, Hannay argues, the private citizen has become 'abstract'; there is nothing in the public space that could count as meaningful and concrete public allegiance; at the same time, the private citizen has become 'uniform', deprived of a distinctive background, let alone a distinctive culture. Hannay thinks that, for all the talk of multiculturalism, actual cultural and ethnic diversity are being drained away. Education has also become a matter of uniformly 'programming' individuals, rather than letting their individuality flourish; and what looks like authentic 'personality' -- mediated through magazines and television -- are really highly marketable personas, rather than actual characters.

So the public space is 'emptied out' -- of actually existing citizens -- and instead is filled with highly mediated 'celebrity culture'. This has consequences not only for politics in a more narrow sense (actual government accountability, for instance), but also for individuals' moral character: according to Hannay, 'a hypothesis worth considering is that a media-filled public space usurps functions that should be part of the individual's own hard and long apprenticeship with life. It puts externalities, outward appearances, in the way of an inner development'. And it might even be that by 'unresistingly grasping the now-vast opportunities offered by the media for voyeurism and illusions of intimacy with the great, we even appear to accept that we are nothing if not in the company of these "true" human beings.'

Finally, public opinion is no longer a collective Voltairean check on the powerful, but a product of polling, or, even worse, of what more or less randomly pops into journalists' heads. In Hannay's words: 'In a world where journalism commands so much attention, more often than not what is called public opinion is a product of what journalists themselves say to one another when they meet at the bar.'

One might or might not agree with these diagnoses -- but they certainly bear more than a passing resemblance to what has always been said about the public sphere: that it is superficial; that it constitutes the prime locus for being inauthentic; and that it is all about the new, about briefly satisfying curiosity (Heidegger's Neugier -- literally, greed for the new), while never allowing the moderns to escape from what Paul Valéry called their néomanie; and that men and women in modern societies are at best ignorant, if not willfully ignorant, spectators of a kind of political show-business, easily swayed emotionally and incapable of anything resembling collective action. In short: the public is the place of and for the masses (or, to revive a distinction once propounded by C. Wright Mills and the early Habermas: instead of 'the public', we have 'the mass').

To be sure, Hannay doesn't put it like this. He carefully hedges his statements and, in any event, the book is meant to be philosophical, and not in any way an empirical historical account. And yet one is left wondering how convincing the decline story in this latest incarnation really is. Two possibilities suggest themselves: first, there really has been a qualitative change or, if you like, structural transformation recently, due, one would think, to structural changes associated with the media and technology more broadly. Rather than having a common focus of interest (political or otherwise), the public has been disaggregated into what Hannay calls 'an assemblage of unintegrated publics-as-audiences'. Technology has largely driven this process: it has become easier to share and to create a seemingly collective 'my space' -- but these are all essentially private phenomena: a highly fragmented public, or even an effectively shattered public, one might say, is almost by definition a severely disempowered public.

The alternative reading, of course, is that it is precisely changes in technology and the media that have empowered individuals, and that have enabled the formation of new communities across vast distances, and, not least, created new demands for accountability vis-à-vis the powerful -- partly because the selection of information and Weltanschauungen -- even by high-minded establishment institutions like the old BBC -- has become more difficult. In fact, the second Iraq war -- when cheap private digital photos made their way into the public and created first scandals and then demands for more accountability -- might mark an interesting contrast with the 1991 Gulf War, when information and, in particular, images, could still be much more tightly controlled. In other words: new connections through new media have also made for new channels to contest what Hannay calls 'the use of this world as a playground for protected privacies, whether by tourists, tuned-in teenagers, or media magnates, or even politicians with personal grudges'.

However, Hannay is highly critical of such optimistic scenarios, mostly for reasons that seem to emanate from quasi-existentialist, quasi-Kierkegaardian background assumptions: what some have termed a 'world-wide electronic agora' is for Hannay more like the equivalent of the sewer on the side of the agora in ancient Athens. Real community, he claims, requires real co-presence and a fixed, real location, which is, if anything, destroyed by the metaphorical 'death of distance'. Whatever pundits and Internet-enthusiasts celebrate looks to Hannay more like a 'location-ignoring, existence-draining form of communication'.

So where then to start with creating what Hannay calls a new 'critical common sense' that would 'enable us to distinguish between less and more distorted versions of what happens in the world'? Again, in somewhat existentialist mode, Hannay thinks that we need to turn back to ourselves -- but not the selves anxiously looking for diversion in a 'world of protected privacies', the selves eager to display themselves, or dissemble, on 'youtube', let alone the selves eager to divert attention from their own nullity, as Hannay puts it a tad harshly. Rather, we need to cultivate inner sources of strength -- and hope for heroic figures whom Hannay refers to as 'new Voltaires'.

That's pretty much all by way of prescription or conclusion that the book has to offer. At least Hannay avoids the nostalgic glance back at supposedly unified, single national publics that many liberal nationalist political philosophers conjure up when trying to vindicate the nation-state -- as if that public had not also been fragmented and, above all, excluded many who did not fit the description of the national citizen. Hannay points out that 'the global public' might well be a myth. The problem is that our 'national publics' of yesteryear are largely myths as well, or, more politely put, pleasing fictions. In a sense, Hannay's essay confirms Geuss's point that, when it comes to 'the public', 'disparate components -- conceptual fragments, theories, folk reactions, crude distinctions that are useful in highly specific practical contexts, tacit value assumptions -- from different sources and belonging to different spheres have come together historically in an unclear way and have accumulated around themselves a kind of capital of self-evidence, plausibility, and motivational force'. But if that's all there is, and if our best hopes and intuitions are already misguided or simply illusionary, it's even less clear how we get from any kind of conceptual or genealogical ground-clearing exercise to the formulation of normative standards for a proper public sphere -- let alone the emergence of 'new Voltaires'.

Overall, Hannay's book is a worthwhile read. It's engagingly written, and full of striking formulations as well as at least some surprising historical observations, and no doubt of use to anyone grappling with the question of the public's nature and its fate in the twenty-first century. It suffers from sometimes being too allusive or, alternatively, apodictic, substituting an aphorism (most often of a vaguely antiliberal nature) for a carefully developed argument. Perhaps that's what the series title 'Thinking in Action' means. Flaws aide, though, the book is bound to stimulate one way or another. And one hopes it will indeed find its public.