On the Trinity: Books 8-15

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Matthews, Gareth B., ed., McKenna, Steven, tr., Augustine: On the Trinity: Books 8-15, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 264pp, $ 20.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521796652.

Reviewed by Roland J. Teske, S.J., Marquette University


This volume reprints books eight through fifteen of Stephen McKenna’s translation of Augustine’s De trinitate; the editor’s introduction exploits these books for various aspects of Augustine’s philosophy of mind, which Mathews approaches from the perspective of contemporary Anglo-American philosophy.

McKenna’s translation was originally published in 1961 in the Fathers of the Church series. Matthews acknowledges that there is an older English translation in the Nicene and Post-Nicene Fathers series, which dates from the late 19th century, and a more recent translation in the Writings of St. Augustine series, which dates from the end of the 20th century. He rejects the latter translation by Edmund Hill, O.P., on the grounds that it is somewhat loose, as it is, and comes from an almost purely theological perspective. He rejects the older translation on the grounds that its language is antiquated and difficult to read, though he admits that it is perhaps the most scholarly. Hill’s translation and introduction is in fact theological in perspective, but the De trinitate is a theological work, which enters into questions of the philosophy of mind only insofar as the human mind is an image of the triune God. Augustine certainly did not set out to write a work on philosophy of mind. Matthews claims that McKenna’s translation was revised for this edition, though I for one would have preferred to see a new translation of the De trinitate rather than a very slight–as far as I can tell–revision of it. Most Augustinian scholars whom I know use the McKenna translation with great caution, always checking it against the Latin. The English language really needs a fresh translation of the De trinitate that avoids the liberties that Hill took with the text of Augustine and that renders the Latin in smooth readable English. Unfortunately, Matthews has not provided such a translation. The French translation in the Bibliothèque Augustinienne series is, on the other hand, both accurate and excellently annotated.

McKenna’s translation is quite good in most places, but seriously flawed in others. Let me point to a few instances where the sense of the passage is, I think, simply lost. In the final chapter of Book 15, McKenna’s translation reads:

And if you yourself were God the Father, as well as the Son, Your Word, Jesus Christ, as the Holy Spirit, Your Gift, we would not read in the Books of the Truth: ‘God sent his Son [cf. Galatians 4:4 and John 3:17], nor would you, O Only-Begotten, say of the Holy Spirit: ‘Whom the Father will send in my name’ [John 4:26] and ‘Whom I will send from the Father’ [John 15:26].

The problem lies in the conditional clause, which, as it stands, implies that God is not the Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit, though, according to Trinitarian doctrine, God is, of course, the Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit. The Bibliothèque Augustinienne translation does much better: “Et si toi, Dieu le Père, étais identique à ton Verbe, Jésus-Christ, à votre Don l’Esprit Saint, nous ne lirons pas … .” That is, Augustine is saying that, if the three persons were one and the same, we would not read that the Father sent the Son or that Christ and the Father sent the Holy Spirit.

As another example, in Book X, chapter 5, McKenna’s translation says:

Whereas it [i.e., the mind] ought to remain steadfast in order to enjoy these things [certain intrinsically beautiful things] wanting to appropriate these things to itself and to be like Him, but not by Him, but by its own self to be what He is, it is turned away from Him… .

The translation in the Bibliothèque Augustinienne edition grasps the adversative relation between the mind’s obligation to enjoy the beautiful things and wanting to appropriate or to claim these things for itself. It reads:

Alors qu’elle devrait demeurer dans la jouissance de ces biens, elle prétend se les attribuer à elle-même; refusant de devenir semblable à Dieu par Dieu, mais voulant par elle-même être ce qu’est Dieu, elle se détourne de lui… .

Matthews finds that Augustine first articulated the sort of philosophy of mind that is normally associated with the great French philosopher of the seventeenth century, René Descartes. He points to the fact that Augustine anticipated Descartes in formulating the “Cogito” argument and in first posing the problem of the knowledge of other minds and in stating what has become the most common response to it, namely, the argument from analogy. Matthews indicates the first psychological or mental triads or trinities that Augustine finds, such as lover, beloved, and love in book 8 and the mind, its knowledge, and its love in book 9. In a few brief paragraphs, Matthews points out some of the puzzling things that Augustine says about inner speech, such as that it is in no language.

Book 10, as Matthews sees it, is the centerpiece of Augustine’s treatise on philosophy of mind. He correctly focuses upon Augustine’s discussion of the mind’s knowledge of itself by reason of its self-presence to itself and upon his argument that the mind is non-bodily, though he does not emphasize, as he should have, Augustine’s distinction between the mind’s knowledge of itself and the mind’s thinking about itself. Augustine uses two Latin terms for these two sorts of knowledge, nosse and cogitare, and the distinction between them is crucial for understanding how, according to Augustine, the mind, which cannot fail to know itself, can still obey the command of the Delphic oracle, “Know thyself.”

Matthews points to elements of Augustine’s doctrine on sense-perception and to his claim that we retain images of objects perceived in memory and can form new ideas by combining images of things we have perceived. Though he touches upon the difficult Augustinian doctrine of divine illumination, he does not cast much, if any light on the topic and skirts the problems of our apparently seeing forms, such as justice, in the mind of God and of Platonic reminiscence along with the pre-existence of the soul, which it entails. Other topics that Matthews discusses include happiness, language learning, divine simplicity, and skepticism and the “cogito.” Matthews has correctly singled out a series of elements in the De trinitate that are of interest to contemporary philosophers of mind.

In three pages Matthews sums up the influence of the De trinitate where he singles out ways in which Anselm, Thomas Aquinas, William Ockham, Descartes, and Malebranche was each influenced by aspects of Augustine’s philosophy of mind. There is a short chronology of Augustine’s life and suggestions for further reading. Here I wish that Matthews had included Johannes Brachtendorf’s volume of essays, Gott und sein Bild: Augustins De trinitate im Spiegel gegenwärtiger Forschung, Schöningh, 2001 and his Die Structur des menschlichen Geistes nach Augustinus: Selbstreflexion und Erkenntnis Gottes in “De Trinitate”, Felix Meiner Verlag, 2000, both of which provide a more profound approach to Augustine’s masterpiece.

All told, the volume would have been more useful if it had reprinted McKenna’s translation of the whole of Augustine’s work and if Matthews had carefully improved McKenna’s translation where it needs improvement and had done a more careful analysis of some of Augustine’s arguments rather than simply pointed to passages in which the bishop of Hippo had anticipated some of the concerns of contemporary philosophers of mind.