On the Universal, the Uniform, the Common and Dialogue between Cultures

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François Jullien, On the Universal, the Uniform, the Common and Dialogue between Cultures, Polity, 2014, 189pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745646237.

Reviewed by Ralph Weber, University of Basel


The original French publication in 2008 of this volume (De l'universel, de l'uniforme, du commun et du dialogue entre les cultures) has filled a notable gap in François Jullien's ambitious philosophical project, which now spans over two decades. The project seeks to take a detour through China to access European philosophy (détour et accès) in an overt attempt at deconstructing the latter from without (déconstruction du dehors). Jullien sees himself as following in the footsteps of Heidegger, Levinas and Derrida, with one important difference: in their work, these towering figures of continental philosophy remained stuck in the very cultural tradition that they were challenging, and thus failed to achieve their goal. Jullien, however, makes use of the geographical, historical and linguistic exteriority of a pre-Western-impact China, which boasted rich textual thought with glosses and commentaries, Jullien asserts, no less reflexive than that of Europe. To be sure, there is also an element of construction on his side, to which he readily admits. As he went along (chemin faisant), Jullien has produced many new concepts and has managed to gradually, ever more coherently construct China's alterity. The ultimate persuasiveness of Jullien's project, however, depends on his claim that Europe has maneuvered itself into a philosophical dead-end and that a non-Eurocentric point of view is possible. Since Jullien's project has hitherto been almost exclusively articulated in view of a Europe defined by its Greek heritage and of China as its philosophical counterpart, one may wonder whether the rest of the world has any role to play in it. In this volume, Jullien finally comes to extend the scope of his investigation in order to offer a more globally comprehensive discussion.

The book can be divided into four parts (outlined in an elegant Itinerary). It takes the reader through a series of wide-ranging arguments offered in a dense, sometimes difficult to disentangle, prose. The text is studded with rhetorical questions and with metaphors and programmatically resorts to allusive use of words and unexplained terms taken from French philosophical discourse (rather nicely captured in the English translation).

Part I, Critique of Notions (chapters 1-3), offers a discussion of the eponymous notions of the universal, the uniform and the common. The universal denotes a rigid concept of reason that is presented as necessary, logical, abstract and prescriptive, yet also quickly undermined by the ready demonstration of the concept's historical singularity as something specific to Europe. The uniform refers to the sort of convenient regularities in the way of life, discourse and opinion shaped by globalization, that is, the indefinite, dictatorial and pandemic diffusion of the similar, pompously pretending to be the universal. The common, finally, is where the political comes in. Unlike the universal and the uniform, the common cannot be reduced to logic or to economics. It is Janus-faced, inclusive and exclusive at the same time (the "flip-side of all 'communitarians'", p. 21), and shows the "groundless ground in which our experience is rooted and to whose deployment it contributes" (p. xi). It is here that we encounter Jullien's favorite way of thinking globally, one that emphasizes the political participatory character of dialogue and that is based on experience as something that can, in some cases, be shared and that is hence possibly intelligible.

Part II, European Genealogy (chapters 4-7), explains how Europe has developed a notion of the universal that it is no longer able to dispel from its mind. Jullien is not out to compose a conceptual history but rather seeks to offer a genealogy, emphasizing different sequences of succession: from the Greek world of poleis to Stoicism; from a pre-Socratic metaphysical quest for the whole (holon) to Socrates himself, who made "the 'whole' into a formal (or logical) exigency" (p. 35), which is when the "elevation of thought" started to be "confused with access to universality" (p. 36); all the way through the first encounter of the universal with the common in the handling of citizenship in Roman empire building (Jullien generally finds much to applaud Rome for, even suggesting that we learn from it "in this new age of globalization", p. 43); and alongside Paul's "neutralization of all markers" (p. 65), going beyond all communitarianism to Christian universalism, setting 'grace', 'love' and eventually 'faith' against Roman law and thereby variously promoting the sort of detached universality that in Jullien's view was to shape European philosophy for good.

Part III, Enquiry and Problematization (chapters 8-11), takes the question of the universal beyond Europe. It is a question, Jullien claims, that cannot be raised today without also inquiring into the existence of similar aspirations in other cultures: "Is the preoccupation with the universal itself universal? Or could it be a theoretical phantasm, even if an eminently productive one, which the West alone has forged -- one that is therefore amazingly singular?" (p. 61). It is not entirely clear how the following quick overview of the "Arabic tradition" and "Arabic logic" (1 page), "Islamic religion" (3 pages) and "India" (3 pages) could lead to the conclusion, on the terms previously outlined, that the preoccupation with the universal is indeed "universal", or how this preoccupation could be anything other than the singular "theoretical phantasm" that Jullien had already established it is. In any case, this blitzkrieg overview leads him to repeat his hypothesis that "Europe has a much greater need to valorize the universal due to the fact that it was constituted from various impulses, ones which did not have a great deal of relation between them, and which remained in a state of tension" (p. 71). No real surprise, it also leads him to consider China as "a final representative case", that is "a culture which boasted of no Revelation" (p. 72). It emerges that China had "no conception of universalism in a theoretical way -- that is as a-priori, separate and prescriptive -- but in a civilizational and 'humanist' way that, as such, doesn't have to separate anything that would transcend it from experience, at least not in a radical way" (p. 74). Quod erat demonstrandum.

More surprising is Jullien's effort again to assimilate Rome with China: for example, by quoting Analects 17:2 and adding that "This is exactly what Cicero said (De legibus, I, 29)" or asserting that "We then understand that the Chinese, just like the Latins, were notably not very enthusiastic about a purely logical universal" (p. 75). Sensing that his quick overview is insufficient to answer the question of the preoccupation with the universal, Jullien then moves on to elaborate further on the "ideal case" of China (ideal in terms of its exteriority) and discusses the notions of "being", "truth" and "time" and the intricacies of translation, which should strike readers of his previous work as highly familiar.

In chapter 9, Jullien begins to delineate the features of the universal that survive his deconstruction. To quote him at some length:

It actually does not consist in a given positive, whatever it might be and as suspect as it is, of the order of values, but in this negative function: that, precisely, of emptying out every formation-institution of its certainty, born of the totalization which is sufficient to itself, and of reopening a breach in this comfort of the enclosure . . . it is necessary to get rid of all lazy representations of a 'constitutive' or a 'given' (that of a universal implied in human nature, or of some 'common ground' of humanity in the name of which all people 'are alike' and so on), and to conceive of the universal in the opposite way as a strict agent and vector (and as such one that is inexhaustible) of promotion (p. 89).

The universal thus emerges as an intellectual, social and political "tool of struggle" (p. 91), one that escapes all reductionism. This at least constitutes its "ideal status"; but again, the question arises how this ideal fares in the face of the "diversity of cultures" (p. 93). Jullien attends to the question in a variety of ways, for instance, by adding a chapter on human rights (which are his paradigmatic example for a preposterous and flawed universalism but which remain an important tool expressive of the negative function, a mere "universality of refusal", p. 115). Human rights are universalizing (Jullien stresses the gerund) in the vector-sense outlined above. They are not something that can be theoretically known, but the significance of human rights is practical, that is, one of operationality. In other words, human rights pertain to the domain of the common.

Part IV, Stakes and Positions (chapters 12-13), seeks to present a more fruitful notion of 'cultures' than is usually on offer in the literature on dialogue between cultures. Jullien raises the stakes when, in the Foreword, he charges existing approaches with faulty design, misplaced political correctness and a "sloppy humanism" (p. ix). The latter is the same term he uses in his Note on the Text when referring to those who attacked his position in the past, those "strident defenders of a sloppy humanism" (p. x), de bruyants défenseurs d'un humanisme mou. In the third part of the book, he reformulates the charge, this time in terms of "a babbling of fine sentiments" (p. 93). So what is Jullien's own position? Of course, like everybody else, even some sloppy humanists, he wants to steer free of "facile universalism" and "lazy relativism" (p. 96). What keeps different cultures on the same plane is "a common intelligence", a specific sort of "communicability in the intelligible" that is constantly and inexhaustibly under way. The common hence emerges not as a basis -- not as what is left when "all the differences between the cultures have been removed (and abstracted)" -- but as a possibility to be exploited. Jullien adds the example of "appreciat[ing] works of art from any age and any tradition", which is possible since we "can communicate with them" (p. 136). The common of humanity can be observed through experience, he goes on to say, even if the variability of experience precludes it from becoming a foundation for the common. Thus, all that can be done in a dialogue between cultures is "to circulate between various intelligibilities so that in each case a coherence springs forth"; "there is nothing, in any culture whatsoever, which would not be intelligible in principle" (p. 138).

There are many points that critics may want to disagree with. One might wonder to what extent Jullien's position on dialogue between cultures is indeed an attractive option. First, it seems that this way of approaching dialogue risks ending up in a monologue since the circulation between various intelligibilities, the ever more coherent construction of alterity, and the reading of sources is the business of one person rather than of a group engaged in a dialogue (to be sure, in this respect, Jullien's take on dialogue between cultures is attractive and offers a corrective to dialogue conceived as a meeting between representatives of various philosophical traditions). But why keep the notion of dialogue between cultures? And why confine singularity to the limits of cultures? Second, even if we assume that Jullien offers a more acceptable notion of the universal and of human rights, how would those notions translate into legal adjudication, political decisions and so on, which seek to achieve closure rather than open new possibilities? Jullien is so adamant in philosophically pushing the practical and the common against a positive function of the universal and against the uniform that he fails to consider the practical implications of his own philosophy. His comment on "the uniformization machine that is 'Brussels'" (p. 163) is superficial at best, but more tellingly, the statement comes out of nowhere, suddenly changing topic. Third, it is not clear to what extent the argument is directed at a straw man. Who would deny that human rights were defined in a specific, even singular, historical context? Is "Europe's universalization of its own culturalism" (p. 89) really much news to anybody?

The more serious, and perhaps more interesting, criticism is situated at the level of argumentation. For long stretches of the text, "cultures" and "civilizations" are talked about as if they were definitively determined by events in the past: "[the utopia of cosmopolitan humanism] has until now ceaselessly worked upon European consciousness, in continuing ancient Stoicism" (p. 32); "Aristotle . . . launches European thought onto a path from which there will be no turning back" (p. 36); "the question . . . opens an abyss in European thought and to a certain extent has formed its fate" (p. 39). "Cultures", "civilizations" and similar terms are also presented as unitary. Indian philosophy, for example, finds itself reduced to Āstika schools, and there are monstrously crude statements of the old Hegelian sort (e.g. "For we know that the adherence to the world in India has remained such that one cannot stand back from it, and that no break occurred there between the intelligible and the perceptible", p. 67). But, then, towards the end, Jullien offers disclaimer after disclaimer and introduces important differentiations (p. 86, p. 95, and chapter 11 "On Cultures"). To cite one example, he writes that "every culture, and above all the culture of Europe, is forever altering itself and mutating, de-specifying itself so as to re-specify in different ways" (p. 145), just to write on the next page that any one culture "maintain[s] an internal intelligence across its alterations and dissensions" (p. 146). The concern is that the argument gets immunized from all criticism. Moreover, the sophisticated notion of "cultures" at the end of the volume does not easily square up with how it is used in the first chapters, which call for a notion of cultures with a stronger identity than a mere "internal intelligence". The same is obviously true of pre-Western-impact China, the mainstay behind Jullien's entire project.

To be fair, each of Jullien's studies only adds additional pieces to, and probes new angles on, what is decidedly an on-going project, many elements of which recur even as they transform. To arrive at a sound judgment of the entire project, a more extensive reading of the philosopher's oeuvre (to date more than 30 volumes) is required. Those attracted by the general thrust of Jullien's narrative in the volume under review and in command of the French language might, for example, turn to his trilogy on logos (Si parler va sans dire. Du logos et d'autres ressources, 2006), the ideal (L'invention de l'idéal et le destin de l'Europe, 2009) and God (Moïse ou la Chine? Quand ne se développe pas l'idée de Dieu, forthcoming). Given the popularity of Jullien's project in some circles of philosophy, it is to be expected that these and other volumes will be made available in English in due time.