On Time, Being, and Hunger: Challenging the Traditional Way of Thinking Life

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Juan Manuel Garrido, On Time, Being, and Hunger: Challenging the Traditional Way of Thinking Life, Fordham University Press, 2012, 150pp., $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823239368.

Reviewed by Eduardo Mendieta, Stony Brook University


This book is part philosophical biology and part fundamental ontology. In fact, it claims that every fundamental ontology is a veiled philosophy of life. Garrido's book, however, also has a bit of the history of the philosophy of biology. At the center of this history of the philosophy of biology is what Garrido calls the 'traditional' conception of life. According to this conception, life is the process of keeping death at bay (2). To be alive is to be given over to the task of not dying. To be alive is to be relentlessly exposed to the possibility of death. Life is essentially hunger, the hunger for life. There is no life without hunger. Hunger is the negativity of death in life. Life, in fact, turns out to be the introduction of the difference between the living and dead. Life is precisely this difference that is not merely ontic but ontological to the living being. Garrido writes:

life is the being of living beings. Life therefore does not have an ontical character; it has an ontological one. One could probably say, as well, that life is in itself the ontological difference, or the bio-ontological difference between the process of living and living beings. (33)

In this formulation Garrido reveals that he is juxtaposing Friedrich Nietzsche's vitalism to Martin Heidegger's anti-biologistic fundamental ontology. In fact, the chapters on Heidegger are quite excellent in that they explain why the rejection of Lebensphilosophie by the young Heidegger was necessary, but not successful. The exegeses of Heidegger's 1929-30 course The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics are illuminating and, I would claim, highly persuasive in demonstrating that Heidegger's neglect of the body is incoherent vis-à-vis the Befindlickeit that is fundamental toDasein. There is no way for Dasein to be in the world without being in some form of affective attunement. This affectivity discloses the world in its distinctness. Dasein's world is thus always its world -- the world it feels. The existential analytic of Being and Time cannot cover up the fact that Dasein is a living body that is delivered to itself in a world in which it can appropriate itself through its sensibility. I am my world and my circumstances, to use José Ortega y Gasset's terminology -- but my circumstances are also my affect.

Now, life as the process of securing one's own life becomes the process of organizing life precisely as the keeping in abeyance of death. Life then is this self-preserving organizing that aims to satiate the hunger that gnaws at the entrails of living beings. In order to satisfy this inextinguishable hunger, living beings constitute themselves as entities with histories. Life, then, is also the history of living. Life is always the history of life. There is no life without the production of time. In order to preserve and persevere in life, the living being must be its own self-organization. The living being is alive so long as it can continue to produce its own organization. Here life's difference from the mechanical is most explicit. Machines are never self-sustaining, self-organizing entities. As Garrido puts it: "Its organized form must endure. Self-organization is the opening of a singular and self-identified duration." (21) In other words, the living entity does not pre-exist time and then get thrown into the stream of time; nor does time pre-exist the living being so that this latter can then be immersed in it, like Heraclitus stepping into the river of time. Instead, the living being produces time, that is temporalizes precisely as this self-sustaining self-preservation. Time is the temporalizing of life. "Rather than being '"in' history or evolution, the formation of the living (of the complex) creates time, history, and evolution; it is itself the self-formation or self-creation of time, history, and evolution." (23)

If time is another name for entropy, then how does it relate to the temporality that life creates? Life, it turns out, is the formation of temporal sequences within the directional flow of entropy. Life, it could be said, is the momentary stalling of entropy by the appropriation of other forms of stalling of entropy. Life is a complex system of entropy transfer. Life is precisely this process of the constitution of complex systems in which entropy is traded. Life is the exchange or transfer of entropy from one complex system to another. The more complex life becomes, the more ways entropy can be traded, though never reversed or stalled. Inasmuch as entropy can never be expunged or reversed, life is a struggle against it. The evolution of life is partly life's answer to the problem of entropy. For evolution is the introduction of plurality in life by self-generated randomness. Thus, life perseveres precisely in its self-sustaining through difference and novelty.

I have thus far touched on some of the key themes of the book: life, death, hunger, time, and how they have been treated by some mighty dead: Aristotle, Nietzsche, Husserl, Heidegger, to name the most discussed. The book also deals with two important themes related to its overall thesis: that the traditional conception of life has exhausted itself and that we philosophers have a duty to contribute to its collapse (100). One theme has to do with the rise of molecular biology and how this challenges our conception of life, as the self-positing self-preservation of beings that do so by organizing their own ways of feeding their hunger. The story of molecular biology was complicated by the emergence of genetics, which then gave rise to molecular genetics. What these developments mean can be summarized in the question: Do living organisms live for molecules or do molecules enable life? This can be rephrased in what I would call the Dawkinsian question of whether genes use phenotypes or phenotypes use genotypes. If life can be reduced to biochemical reactions in cells, then how is the traditional conception of life at all sustainable? Garrido is right to affirm that reducing life to biochemical reactions extinguishes life, or covers up the majestic mystery of life. For life is the entire process of living, and living is not simply one set of chemicalreactions. A living being is not one organ, not one process, not one function, not one capacity, but the synergistic synthesis of reactions, organs, functions, and capabilities. In this sense, Garrido is right to say that: "Life is the fact of being alive and not dead, or the fact of being in place of one's own death, which is always to come. Life is never given as a whole, but as something to complete, as the task or the process of keeping oneself alive." (33)

The second theme is closely related to the first theme, and it has to do with the relationship between life and evolution, now seen from the perspective of molecular genetics. Natural selection, which leads to evolution, cannot be understood as a telic, purposive, intentional, directional process. Instead, what natural selection shows is that the generation of forms of life is a "spontaneous," "nonpurposive," and "automatic" process. In other words, life is self-generating self-preservation in the midst of chaos or catastrophe. "Nothing produces the formation of living forms." (90) We ought to think of evolution as the management of contingency by life. Natural selection is this contingency. It is tychism—to use Charles Sanders Peirce's language--in the very heart of nature. Precisely because tychism is nature itself, the living itself is its evidence. The living is discontinuity within life. It is a fundamental aspect of living beings that they generate plurality. Life is novelty as plural forms of self-preserving, with their corresponding and singular temporalized durations, or distinct 'selves.' Here, as proof, I would point out the contrast among the emperor penguins from Antarctica, double-humped ( Bactrian) camels, and hummingbirds. The first will submit to incredible feats of hunger and cold to nest their offspring. The second can eat snow, and sometimes even marsh water, and essentially anything that can be torn and chewed, and can survive in extreme desert conditions by tapping into their hump reserves. The third are gorgeous, fragile and ephemeral creatures that must eat continuously in order be able to sustain their flying acrobatics, which alone allows them to get more nectar than their own weight just barely allowing them to survive.

Evidently, this book is fascinating. It is full of provocative and aphoristic formulations, and it raises a series of important questions, while also offering insightful readings of at least Aristotle, Nietzsche and Heidegger. There are three issues that need to be raised that in my analysis cast an ominous shadow over the many virtues of this wonderful text. One of the central theses ofGarrido's book is that hunger is not ontic but ontological to life. To be alive, to be living, is precisely to be delivered over to one's hunger, and to have to deal with it, as a way to keep death at bay.Garrido writes: "Hunger is structural to self-organization. Hunger is not a lack that can be fulfilled in order to restore equilibrium and harmony. Hunger is original or factual." (41) Here is another striking formulation:

Hunger is the unprotected and unprotectable exposure of life to the risks of its suppression. In itself, hunger is ultimately unconcerned with the task or the concern of not ceasing to be; it becomes indifferent to any so-called necessity of protecting life. (84)

Or, "Hunger is the emergence of the living being or its being delivered to its ownmost and innermost self. Life itself is nothing other than the movement of such a delivery." (101) I think thisontologization of hunger threatens to reduce life to a management of lack and negativity. By Garrido's own account, life is also the delivering of oneself to oneself as novelty, as newness. The enduring temporality of the 'self' of the living is not solely driven by self-organization against hunger. Living beings are neither omnivorous mouths nor bottomless stomachs. The ontological affectivity of living beings speaks against this. The living is alive to its hunger, but also to its happiness and dread, anxiety and comfort, weariness and contentment. It is not arbitrary that we hunger for love, solidarity, comprehension, understanding, forgiveness, and redemption. We are hungry, but for what? What we hunger for does reveal who we are.

But, Garrido is concerned with hunger as an expugnable lack, the nothingness at the heart of the living. This is what Heidegger called "Das Nicht" of Dasein's temporalizing in "What is Metaphysics?" (1929) where he wrote: "Da-sein means: being held out into the nothing."[1] Indeed, the nothing that becomes hunger is very different from the nothing that is the possibility of freedom and history for humans. Hunger does turn out to be an ontic dimension that reveals something truly ontological, the nothing of human temporality. We cannot abjure Heidegger so quickly. But by the same token, neither can we abjure Hannah Arendt, who taught us to think of the being of the human being as primarily determined by natality, rather than being-unto-death. To be alive is to have been given birth to, as something unique, to be one's own. To be born, however, is to be exposed to the vulnerability of one's neoteny, one’s having been born premature and unfinished, mangled as Nietzsche put it. To be alive is to potentially spawn unexpected life, which is turn vulnerable and commands our attentiveness and care. To be alive is to be exposed to other living beings and to expose the living to life, to their own vulnerability. Natality and novelty go hand in hand, and they are ontologically prior to hunger. For it can be claimed that it is because we are natal that we can crave otherness as a way to deal with hunger. To be born means to be thrown into existence incomplete and unfinished, thus allowing for otherness to appear as what may bridge the abyss of temporality that yawns in our existence. Again, living beings also have different ways of dealing with hunger, which is evidence of their own natality.

There is, however, something else that demonstrates why hunger is not as ontologically fundamental as Garrido would like to make it, and that is that most living beings don't die of hunger, albeit they certainly can. In the natural world, most animals die because they are either eaten, or their habitats have been converted into deserts or suburban enclaves. Most humans throughout human history have not died of hunger, but of human cruelty, exploitation, war and genocide. Hunger can be one of the causes of our death, but it is by no means the only or most important one. This brings me to my second issue with Garrido's book. I am not sure how one can write the following sentence, without exposing oneself to severe censure: "The problem of hunger is that hunger -- the want of securing life -- cannot have a solution. The problem is the infinite voracity of living beings: that famine is greed and greed is famine." (81) Sentences like these are the reason why political ontology and any ontology at all get such negative attention in philosophy. First, to be a living being is precisely to contend with hunger and everything else that life means. To live is to contend and have contended with hunger. If living beings were only busy attempting to satisfy their hunger, they would be on the brink of survival. To be alive is partly to have solved the problem of hunger; otherwise there is no living, but mere survival. Second, different living beings live by satisfying their hunger differently. Life is precisely the difference in hunger, in hungering, and thus, in being able to cope with it differently. Third, famine is not greed, and greed is not famine. Famine is a social fact, a social occurrence, one may even say, a social institution. Like war, famine requires a tremendous effort and social organization. Famine is organized privation so as to prevent humans from obtaining basic food for their survival. Natural disasters may lead to droughts and crop failures, but the deaths that result in famine are result of what we can call organized inaction. Greed is a human passion that can lead to others' privation, but not to their starvation, or at least not directly. Organized greed, that is, greed that is sanctioned and given efficacy through economic and political institutions, can lead to famine. But, again, as a human passion it can take many forms.

The third issue has to do with the call that allegedly follows from Garrido's analysis, namely:

The traditional way of thinking life is on the verge of being exhausted everywhere in everyday life, everywhere we believe it may be a question of life. Philosophy is called to think such a collapse of the traditional way of thinking life. It is to my eyes a philosophical task, and therefore a political duty, to witness and thereby to contribute to its collapse. (100)

Biopolitics, in its Foucauldian, Harawayian, Latourian variants, may be so many ways of expressing the crises of the traditional way of thinking life. A worldview, of whatever kind, does not exhaust itself. It becomes untenable. It is not pushed to the limits until it collapses, but rather it is criticized to the point that its basic assumptions are no longer acceptable or coherent. Through criticism it becomes either an impediment to proper understanding, or becomes a historical memento that is instructive inasmuch as it stands for a set of assumptions we no longer hold. Garrido'sarguments rely precisely on that which he would like us to get over and leave behind. But in so doing, he is cutting the branch on which he is standing. Is not hunger precisely that which gives coherence to the traditional concept of life?

These "issues" aside, I think Garrido is forcing us to think about what new concept of life is dawning, especially in the age in which molecular genetics promises to solve the problems of aging, and putatively, of death. The same is promised by the convergence among genetics, nanotechnology, and supercomputers: eternal conscious life uncoupled from organic platforms. The promise of eternal life, as oxymoronic at this notion might be, is a panacea that has propelled humans since the dawn of human history. The living that does not die is no longer alive. It has become something else. If life is a gift, death is its blessing, as Hans Jonas put it. Were we to cease to die, we would cease to be human, for it is ontologically decisive for humans that we are mortal, that is, of time, in time, and for time. We would be gods, and as gods, we would not be concerned with hunger, or affected by the many passions that our embodiment exposes us to. But, we remain human so long as we can die, and we die of many causes, many of them having to do with human institutions, but least of all because of hunger, although far too many humans die of it for reasons unrelated to their "ownmost or innermost self." It is part of the horror of the human condition that we can be exposed to the banality of evil, which can take the form of famine, but also to the gift of human solidarity and empathy that can lead to acts of moral heroism, which is beyond and above hunger and death.

[1] Martin Heidegger, Pathmarks, edited by William McNeill (Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1998), 91.