On Translation

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Paul Ricoeur, On Translation, trans. Eileen Brennan, Routledge, 2006, 66pp., $17.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415357784.

Reviewed by David Pellauer, DePaul University


This small book brings together three late essays by Paul Ricoeur along with a brief introduction by Richard Kearney. Translation as an issue was hinted at for a long time in Ricoeur's work on hermeneutics since it so obviously overlaps with questions about the nature of interpretation. These essays represent the first time, however, that he directly addressed this topic. The essays were prepared for different occasions, so there is some overlap among them. Still, one can discern a cumulative effect from their chronological appearance. Let me say immediately that, like all of Ricoeur's work, they are insightful and worth reading as they stand. However, they are important beyond this in that they also point to new questions Ricoeur was addressing in the latter years of his life. These questions are important for anyone seeking to extend Ricoeur's hermeneutical reflections. They also point to questions for philosophy in general insofar as it takes seriously the work done over the past few decades on hermeneutics in relation to language and the impact this must have on philosophy.

In the first essay, "Translation as Challenge and Source of Happiness," first presented in 1997 at a ceremony awarding a prize for Franco-German translation, Ricoeur takes up what he sees as "translation's great difficulties and small delights" (3). Beginning with the difficulties, he says that what the translator does is itself something like a wager, but also something that takes work. To develop further this idea of the translator's work, Ricoeur uses an analogy drawn from Freud's notions of a work of remembering and one of mourning, in order to show that while a good translation can always accomplish something, it can do so only by always also acknowledging some loss. Because of this tension between gain and loss, we can say that both a commitment to faithfulness and an always-possible suspicion of betrayal always bind the translator, where translation as process and result occupies a middle ground between these two limit cases. Continuing to use images drawn from Freud, Ricoeur next argues that translation runs into resistance in that it can be seen as a threat to the target language since we can always ask whether this language can really say what was already said in the other foreign, source language. He draws on Antoine Berman's The Experience of Translation: Culture and Translation in Romantic Germany as an apt illustration of this worry.[1] Resistance can also come from the other side, that of the source language. There it is expressed by the presumption of non-translatability. This is the presumption that what is said in one language cannot be said in another one. Ricoeur's own position is that this is a "fantasy nourished by the banal admission the original will not be duplicated by another original" (5), a fantasy that itself usually gets strengthened by another fantasy, that of a perfect translation.

He concedes that once translation begins, it will always include segments of untranslatability. By this, he means those inevitable failures or losses in transferring what is said in one language to another. Such losses are due to such factors as differing semantic fields, intertextual references, syntactical differences, idioms, and even the "half-silent connotations, which alter the best-defined denotations of the original vocabulary, and which drift, as it were, between the signs, the sentences, the sequences, whether short or long" (6). Beyond this, and central to any theory of translation, there is the problem that there exists no neutral third language that can mediate between the source and target language. That is, we cannot mechanize translation by first translating the source text into an established unambiguous language that itself can then be translated without loss into the target language. The fact is that any evaluation of the accuracy or adequacy of any translation will depend on people who are sufficiently bilingual to attempt a retranslation of the work in question. What is at issue therefore is always what Ricoeur calls the paradox of an equivalence that is never completely adequate. This is why major works such as the Bible or Homer or Dante are always subject to retranslation.

The work of mourning here then is that we must give up the idea of the perfect translation and accept that translation always works through approximation. This is not easy to admit, Ricoeur adds, pointing to at least two other ways in which the fantasy of a perfect translation keeps returning. One is the Enlightenment ideal of a universal library "from which all untranslatabilities would have been erased" (9) yielding a rationality freed from all cultural constraints and local peculiarities. The other is the dream of a perfect language, the kind of messianic expectation expressed by Walter Benjamin. This would be a pure language into which every language could be translated and where nothing would be lost. What giving up these two unrealizable dreams achieves, Ricoeur says, is "the happiness associated with translating" (10). Indeed, this points to the need for what he calls a "linguistic hospitality" that welcomes what is foreign.

But, as we see from his next two essays, it is the avowal that translation is possible but never perfect that has the most significant philosophical implications for Ricoeur.

The second essay, "The Paradigm of Translation," begins by making a distinction between two senses of translation, the one strict, the other broad. By the strict sense, Ricoeur means the case of interlingual translation; by the broad one he has in mind an intralingual sense of translation "synonymous with the interpretation of any meaningful whole within the same speech community" (11). He begins with the former sense in order to be able to reach a conclusion about the latter one.

Thinking about interlingual translation gives rise to difficulties and even paradoxes for a number of reasons. First among them is the fact that there exists a diversity of languages. Why should this be so? It runs counter to the idea of evolutionary efficiency, so popular as a universal explanation today. Next, there is the universality of language in that all these different languages are languages. It is, Ricoeur says, as though a universal competence was "contradicted by its scattered achievements" (12). This puzzle has led to speculation about language, either through the myth of an original perfect language, or to an attempted philosophy of language that aims at the same goal of perfection. In both cases, the operative assumption is that the diversity of different natural languages represents a scandal, if not an irremediable disaster. Yet, Ricoeur counters, this diversity is not completely a disaster because people have always translated, particularly in border regions, or out of a desire for commerce or diplomacy or even espionage. What this then suggests is that "every speaker has the ability to learn and use languages other than his own" (13). Ricoeur does not draw the implication at this point, but by the end of the book one can see that he is beginning to consider the question that arises out of this fact: is any language better than all others? Here, though, he chooses instead to assert that the ability to translate depends at least in part on language's ability to reflect upon itself, to be able to be used to speak of itself both as language and as a language among languages. This is, at least to some extent, what makes it possible for linguistic hospitality to acknowledge the existence of other languages and be receptive to them.

Ricoeur then shifts gears slightly based on the acknowledgement that translation is possible. Untranslatable versus translatable are "ruinous alternatives" (14) that need to be replaced by the more practical question of faithfulness versus betrayal, what the first essay had considered in terms of necessary loss. Before turning to this new polarity, however, he pauses to consider why attempts to speculate about the possibility or impossibility of translation always reach a speculative impasse. One reason is that theorists sometimes overemphasize what cannot be superimposed on one language from another, whether this be stated in terms of the very sound system of a language, or its conceptual networks, or its syntax -- or worse, the idea that each language represents an utterly unique worldview. If such were the case, Ricoeur suggests, "bilinguals would have to be schizophrenics" (15). This is why he thinks theories about translation tend to swing to the other extreme, the search for hidden structures that either stem from a lost original language or that represent the universal a priori codes of any possible language. In a word, Ricoeur is skeptical about the success of any such effort, particularly when it is phrased in terms of the latter possibility. The problem, he says, is "not the imperfections of the natural languages but their very functioning" (17). This is why there is no consensus on what would constitute a perfect lexicon. Even more important, no one has been able to show how to derive a natural language from a supposed "perfect language." Still, he repeats, translation exists, so the question is how is this possible.

Returning to answers in terms of myth, he turns to the story of the tower of Babel. His suggestion is that this myth can (and should?) be read as "the non-judgemental acknowledgement of an original separation" (18) rather than as a myth of origins. The basis of this claim will be more apparent to biblical exegetes than to most philosophers. What Ricoeur is saying here is that not just the story of Babel but the opening chapters of the book of Genesis leading up to it should be read in terms of the wisdom traditions of the Ancient Near East rather than as a quasi-scientific myth of origins. From this wisdom perspective, what the tower of Babel story says is that this is how things are. There are many languages, and this is said with no recrimination, no lamentation, no accusation. This is where we must begin. However, Ricoeur next adds, we need further to recognize the existence of a desire to translate, one that goes beyond mere utility. As Berman's work has shown, part of this desire stems from a desire to broaden the horizons of one's own native language, not only to add to it, but to discover its own inherent but unrecognized potential.

Next, we have to acknowledge that there exists no absolute test of what is a good translation. As stated in the first essay, a good translation can only aim at an adequate equivalence, one "not founded on a demonstrable identity of meaning." In this second essay, Ricoeur speaks of this as "an equivalence without identity" (22), one that involves ethical questions as well as theoretical and practical ones. This brings him to the question of the broader sense of translation, intralingual translation. Interlingual translation shows that it is possible to translate in more than one way; intralingual translation goes further and shows that "it is always possible to say the same thing in another way" (25). Ricoeur passes over the radical implication here that there is no uniquely right way to say anything, although I do not see how he can avoid it or that it would really bother him. I say this because, after having briefly considered how all translation involves not just words, but also sentences and even whole texts, texts as a whole, he concludes that "for want of a full description, we have only points of view, perspectives, partial visions of the world. That is why we have never ceased making ourselves clear, making ourselves clear with words and sentences, making ourselves clear to others who do not see things from the same angle as we do" (27). This is why he chooses to relate his claim about being able to say the same thing in different ways to the idea of sameness without identity, a claim that recalls the distinction he made between idem-identity and ipse-identity in his Gifford Lectures, published as Oneself as Another.[2] It is this idea of sameness without identity that links inter- and intralingual translation in that it suggests that there is "something foreign in every other" (25), pointing to the importance of a dialogical approach to language. It is with others that we work out ways to say things, to define and explain them.

But it is not clear that we ever reach an end of this process, as opposed to "points of view, perspectives, partial visions of the world. That is why we have never ceased making ourselves clear, making ourselves clear with words and sentences, making ourselves clear to others who do not see things from the same angle as we do" (27). Ricoeur closes this essay with the reminder that this is why we have to pay attention not just to words and sentences but also to texts, to uses of language that go beyond individual sentences -- and that are not reducible to the truth values of these individual sentences and their logical conjunction, something he had argued for at length in his own treatment of narrative discourse. Furthermore, this helps us understand why a critic like George Steiner, in After Babel, could place so much emphasis on the always-possible use of language to say something other than what is true or real.[3] Not only can we say things in different ways, but we can also "say something that is other than what is the case" (28), a fact that Ricoeur admits perplexes him. Still, he ends once again with the affirmation that it is important to take seriously language's ability to reflect upon itself and to consider how this is the key to making sense of language's ability to refer -- to translate! -- itself beyond itself.

Ricoeur's third essay is the shortest of the lot. It is directed again to what Ricoeur sees as the paradox of translation, this time considered in terms of what he names as the untranslatable. This untranslatable can take different senses. First, there is the very fact of the multiplicity or diversity of languages, which cannot be translated in the sense of being reduced into a single overarching language. Ricoeur does not repeat his earlier point that no proposed ideal language has been able to generate an actual natural language, but the point bears repeating here. Second, there is the problem of how sense and reference get combined in different languages -- and how to find a way to talk about this from the perspective of one particular language. Ricoeur's suggestion here is again that we have to take seriously the example of texts, of extended discourse, not just individual words or sentences to even begin to approach this question. In fact, it is a text that the translator always finally has to work with, even when confronted with a single sentence. In such cases, the text in question is the whole conglomeration of cultural knowledge that the translator draws on to make sense of this one sentence.[4] Third, there is untranslatability at the level of the words actually chosen, what comes down to the glossary chosen in producing any translation. Finally, there is the question, again, how do translators do it, for they do. Ricoeur now poses the issue in terms of the idea of meaning, for translation theory seems always to presuppose a prior existing meaning that the translation is supposed to render, to seek to be equivalent to. He now proposes challenging this presupposition to consider the possibility that such equivalence may be produced through translation rather than presupposed by it. Invoking the title of a work by Marcel Détienne titled Comparer l'incomparable,[5] he ponders briefly the implications of what it might mean to say that translation points to a case where the comparable is in fact something constructed. Drawing on my own conversations with Ricoeur over the years, I would say that this is another of those points (like the case of basic values) where he would say that the line between invention and discovery is blurred. Thomas Kuhn, in his own reflections on the difference between translation and interpretation, reinforces the argument that might be developed here by noting that knowing two languages does not make one a translator: it is only a necessary not a sufficient condition.[6] Ricoeur's closing point, however, is an even larger one: that any theory of meaning has to incorporate the question of the production of meaning, what he elsewhere spoke of as semantic innovation.

[1] Antoine Berman, L'épreuve de l'étranger (Paris: Gallimard, 1984); The Experience of the Foreign: Culture and Translation in Romantic Germany, trans. S. Heyvaert (Albany: SUNY Press, 1992).

[2] Paul Ricoeur, Oneself as Another, trans. Kathleen Blamey (Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press, 1992).

[3] George Steiner, After Babel: Aspects of Language and Translation, 3rd edition (New York: Oxford University Press, 1998)

[4] Roger T. Bell, Translation and Translating: Theory and Practice (London and New York: Longman, 1991) makes a strong case for this claim from the perspectives of linguistics. But although he shows what happens in translation, he does not show it happens.

[5] Marcel Détienne, Comparer l'incomparable (Paris: Seuil, 2000).

[6] See, e.g., Thomas Kuhn, "Commensurability, Comparability, Communicability," idem., The Road Since Structure, ed. James Conant and John Haugeland (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2000), 33--57; see also "The Road Since Structure," ibid., 92.