On What Matters, Volume III

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Derek Parfit, On What Matters, Volume III, Oxford University Press, 2017, 468 pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198778608.

Reviewed by Mark van Roojen, University of Nebraska-Lincoln


The first two volumes of On What Matters started out as Climbing the Mountain, a shorter work of normative ethics aimed at showing how three seemingly diverse approaches to normative questions (rule consequentialism, Kantian normative ethics, and contractualism) were all getting at the same normative truths from different directions. At some point Parfit decided he had also to defend metaethical non-naturalism as part of this project, so he added a second volume. As he admits (54), the ecumenical treatment of normative diversity in the first volume did not extend to the rival metaethical views discussed in its sequel. His oppositions to rival views was stark. Naturalism, noncognitivism and subjectivism had to be fundamentally mistaken, or nothing would in fact matter.

In Volume III, Parfit labors to extend his ecumenicism to metaethics, though not to every metaethical view. He works to understand other theorists as attempting to get at the same fundamental normative reality as he is, and to view seeming disagreement as masking an underlying harmony. Parfit found it deeply unsettling that people such as Bernard Williams, Alan Gibbard, Peter Railton, Sharon Street and Friedrich Nietzsche would find views at odds with his own compelling. If his arguments are really as strong as he took them to be, how could these brilliant theorists not be persuaded? Volume III is his attempt to grapple with the issue, show that there is less disagreement than meets the eye, and argue that remaining disagreements should be resolved to vindicate his variety of non-naturalism, "Non-realist Cognitivism." It also includes a final section where he returns to the first-order normative issues that were the original focus when he was still most interested in climbing the normative mountain.

The book is partly a response to a companion volume edited by Peter Singer, Does Anything Really Matter? In that volume various leading lights, including Gibbard and Railton, respond to OWM I and II. While some of these theorists make clear they think Parfit is just wrong, Gibbard and Railton are more concessive, at least in tone. This allows Parfit to argue that they really do (nearly) agree after all and to retain his confidence in Non-realist Cognitivism. Unfortunately, this somewhat obscures the exact contours of his own position by allowing him to avoid confronting more direct challenges to it and also to avoid confronting some of the main worries about his arguments for that position. And unless these particular theorists (along with those who already accept non-naturalism) are his only true epistemic peers, it isn't obvious the underlying worry has been dissolved. For unsurprisingly, there's little consensus about the best views among metaethicists in general.

Non-realist Cognitivism is a newfangled variant of non-naturalism. Moral and normative judgements are cognitive and have objective purport. Normative claims predicate normative properties of objects and actions and are not equivalent to any claims predicating natural properties of these same objects. Normative properties are non-natural. They cannot be identified with any natural properties captured by nonmoral terms (56-7), nor can they be reduced to natural properties via some asymmetric grounding relation (145 ff.). They can be analyzed in terms of normative reasons, but with reasons we hit bedrock. We can say that normative reasons count in favor of this or that option, but that claim is itself normative and should not be confused with any claims about psychology or motivation since such claims would be natural and not normative. (57)

So far, this position looks like a version of old fashioned non-naturalism, committing itself to properties distinct from natural properties. But, in an attempt to avoid objections to the underlying metaphysics, Parfit's denies that these non-natural properties are "ontologically weighty." (3) Taking his cue from the observation that any claim that is overtly about properties can be paraphrased by an ordinary predication using a property term, he suggests that property talk is merely pleonastic. (66) Just as 'The ball has the property of being red' says neither more nor less than 'The ball is red,' 'Some actions have the property of being wrong' says no more and no less than 'Some actions are wrong.' This, Parfit thinks, justifies making a distinction between properties in a pleonastic and minimal sense and properties in a more robust "ontologically weighty" (68) sense. Normative properties, mathematical properties and other non-empirical properties are among these pleonastic properties. The predicates 'is' and 'exists' also get minimal senses alongside their more robust senses (61), whereas 'is true' does not. (172) Moral judgements incorporate a claim that the thinker is "getting it right." (175) This claim to objective purport is equivalent to a claim to truth. (175 ff.) What it would be to be ontologically weighty is left for those who disagree with him to explain. (60) Parfit just denies that moral properties are ontologically heavyweight in any sense that could raise ontological worries.

Alongside the distinction between pleonastic and heavyweight properties lies another. Parfit distinguishes two "senses" of 'property' -- properties in a "description-fitting" sense and in the "necessarily co-extensional" sense (68), and seems to think there are two kinds of properties corresponding to these senses. Necessarily co-extensional properties are the same just in case they have the same extensions both in actuality and across all counterfactual possibilities. Description-fitting properties are the same when they satisfy the same descriptions of their natures, descriptions which Parfit seems to think are used when we refer to them either in thought or language. This casts what you might think of as a disagreement over property individuation between people like Frank Jackson, who think that necessarily coextensive properties are identical to one another, and non-naturalists who think that moral properties can share extensions with natural properties and yet be distinct, as a kind of linguistic misunderstanding. It also runs together two sorts of issues: (1) fineness of grain -- should properties be individuated more finely than extensional individuation would allow? and (2) what individuates properties if they are more fine-grained than that?

Parfit often seems to identify pleonastic properties with description-fitting properties, or at least treat them as a subset of the description-fitting properties (as on page 66), but this turns out to be at least somewhat puzzling, insofar as his considered view is that we can't descriptively characterize the basic normative properties. (See below.)

The pleonastic property/ontological property distinction raises some puzzles. That it is OK to use property talk whenever we can correctly use a predicate does lend support to the idea that property terminology adds nothing to what we are already saying in using ordinary predicates. But it does not by itself license the conclusion that talk of this or that property is ontologically lightweight. This would depend on the meaning of the original predicate. 'Has the property of being a black hole' and 'is a black hole' say the same thing, but neither makes an ontologically lightweight claim. The observation that property talk is pleonastic at most shows that we can use property terms without any commitment to robust properties. But it does not show that they are not robust. If you think that some true predications have robust truth conditions, you should also think that the properties they predicate are robust, even if all property talk is merely pleonastic. It's thus not clear that the "pleonastic properties" should all be thought of as non-robust, nor that Parfit means to use the term to indicate that they are. So much for the position in outline.

Volume III begins by rehearsing the two main arguments against naturalism from earlier volumes, the "Normativity Objection" and the "Triviality Objection." Both objections assume a neo-Fregean conception of thought and language. Thoughts about things are mediated by senses. For most properties, these senses are descriptions of these properties, and they refer to the property that (near enough) matches the description. (71-2) But these descriptions themselves ascribe properties to the properties whose reference they mediate. So to avoid a regress some terms/thoughts must pick out properties in another way.[1] Our "simpler normative concepts," such as "normative reasons" and "impermissible," are indefinable and "do not describe some property, so we cannot claim that they refer to the properties that they describe. These concepts are in this way like non-descriptive names, so we must explain in some other way which are the properties to which these concepts refer." (73)

Parfit goes on to suggest that we can ostensively define ordinary indescribable natural properties. But we can't point to the indefinable normative properties. We must instead "get people to think thoughts that involve these concepts." (74) This is a bit obscure, but it looks like the idea is that such thoughts give us a sort of acquaintance with the property in the mind, sufficient for knowing what the referent of the relevant term is. He must have thought that knowing what a referent is in this sense makes its nature transparent to the knower. That would explain why it seemed to him obvious that:

Normativity Objection: Irreducibly normative reason-implying claims could not, if they were true, state normative facts that were also natural facts. (72)

If I understand him correctly, Parfit thought that, when reference is mediated by a descriptive sense, that sense gives us the nature of the property. And when it is mediated by ostension or its analogue in thought we at least get enough acquaintance with it to learn what it could not be. (74) And this puts us in a position to see that normative facts and properties could not be natural.

Parfit is aware that many naturalists will dissent from this picture, citing synthetic identities as counter-examples; two things or properties previously thought to be distinct can turn out to be one and the same thing upon investigation. These naturalists will endorse

(C) as these scientific analogies show, truths about the identities of properties may not match, or closely depend upon, the concepts with which we refer to these properties. (75)

An opponent could accept (C) for at least two sorts of reasons. She could think that concepts can misrepresent their referents, or she could deny that reference must be mediated by sense-like concepts. She could also reject (C) but think that two perfectly good descriptions pick out one and the same thing without obviously doing so. Parfit seems to recognize only the first option, and he counters that most descriptive words or phrases must fairly accurately describe their referents. This by itself would not be very controversial, or even to the point, if descriptive words or phrases comprised only overt descriptions. But Parfit thinks most nouns have their reference mediated by a descriptive sense. If he's right, 'heat', which Millians treat as a directly referential kind term, instead refers via a description of heat's effects on our senses and the environment. (76). And similarly for most other referential terms.

Granted that assumption, we still can wonder what rules out accurate but co-referential descriptions, one naturalistic, the other normative. Parfit allows that distinct co-referential descriptions are possible, but only if at least one of them has "a gap waiting to be filled." (77) The description, that property, whatever it is, that melts solids, turns liquids to gas, and causes burning sensations, which is the concept of heat, can turn out to be satisfied by high mean molecular energy. Thus 'being hot' and 'having high mean molecular energy' can pick out one and the same property. But when we get to the normative, we hit a barrier. Normative descriptive concepts must use normative roles to specify their contents. Such a concept would be that of a normative role-filler, so that we could not use it to pick out the referent of the very normative terms used to specify the role. For example, "that property, whatever it is, that makes things right" specifies what it is to be a right-maker, but not what rightness is. (77-83) Why limit the discussion to normative specifications of the relevant role for normative properties? Might not the relevant role be specifiable in other terms? Jackson and Pettit propose just this sort of view, and Jackson is one of Parfit's interlocutors. Jackson and Pettit argue that we can use Ramsification to strip out moral vocabulary from complex specifications of normative role concepts. A given normative property is that property which plays the non-normatively specified role. Parfit's discussion of Jackson focuses mostly on the disagreement over necessary co-extension as a criterion of property identity and so does not address the present issue. Perhaps Parfit missed the relevance of Jackson's views because of his belief that no one takes analytic naturalism seriously. (57)

As noted, reference to the basic normative properties is not description-mediated. Why then are we still able to see that their nature is incompatible with their being natural? On one natural picture, direct reference to a property unmediated by any descriptive sense would be compatible with ignorance of the nature of the referent. I speculate that Parfit rejects direct reference even to indefinable properties. He instead thinks that reference to these properties is mediated by something else that plays the sense role. We acquaint a subject with these senses when we get the subject to think with a concept of the indefinable property in question, and being so acquainted gives insight into the nature of that property. And this puts us in a position to see that it could not be natural. If I'm right, it is crucial to Parfit's argument that all thought be sense-mediated.

Relatedly, the Triviality Objection trades on the informativeness of normative claims connecting normative properties picked out with overtly normative vocabulary and properties picked out using naturalistic vocabulary. The objection goes like this. Take a claim identifying a normative property with an explicitly natural property, for example,

(A) being an act that minimizes suffering is the same as being an act that is right. (85)

Were these two properties in fact to be identical, such claims would be trivial, or nearly so. They would convey only "negative" information. (A) would tell us only that the property of being right is not a "different" property than the property of maximizing suffering. But (A) strikes us as telling us something positive, of which we might be ignorant.

Fregean theories of the sort that Parfit has constructed are one approach to capturing the informational relevance of various identity claims. They do this by, in effect, including the way that a referent is picked out in the contents of thought and as a component of the propositions that are that content. Propositions about Parfit's description-fitting properties incorporate the description into the concepts that compose the proposition expressed using description fitting-property terms. Identity claims are informative when the descriptions picking out the referent are different. But that is not the only way to explain informative identities. Two expressions may semantically encode the very same content and that content might be a single proposition, and yet it can be informative to learn that they do, perhaps because the information involved is conveyed by something other than the semantic content of the terms. For example, this information might be part of what is pragmatically conveyed by a speaker, perhaps in virtue of word choice. Parfit does not tell us what's wrong with this alternative approach, nor does he seem aware of it. (For more on this, see Dowell and Sobel).

Volume III elaborates and clarifies the metaethics of Volumes I and II, and one could read it, rather than those volumes, and likely understand Parfit better than if one read those two volumes alone. But the main point of this third volume is to engage with the views of respected peers not won over by the argument as previously presented. Parfit thus moves beyond exposition to engage with the authors in the companion Singer-edited volume. He explains where he has modified his own views in response to several of these authors, rebuts their arguments at other points, and describes how further modifications of the views in question might lead to a meeting of the minds. He engages with Alan Gibbard and Simon Blackburn over expressivism and quasi-realism, Peter Railton over his style of naturalism, Mark Schroeder and Michael Smith over subjectivism and the nature of reduction, Frank Jackson about properties, Sharon Street over subjectivism and debunking arguments, Steven Darwall and Bernard Williams over the nature of reasons and internalism, as well as with Friedrich Nietzsche, via the work of Andrew Huddleston.

But the main focus is on Gibbard and Railton, perhaps because their conciliatory tone mutes the nature of their remaining disagreements. Each of them, in slightly different ways, grants Parfit a finer grained notion of properties and propositions than one individuated by a modal extension.

Railton argues that supervenience constraints make the relationship between the natural and the normative very close, close enough that we might have just one property referred to and thought about in two different ways -- one naturalistic, the other normative. And he amiably suggests that the importance of value facts would be the same on this view as it is on Parfit's two-property view. (Singer, 57) Parfit responds that he can accept nearly everything Railton says in support of naturalism, except for naturalism itself. Railton has only to go a little bit further to come to a wholly satisfying view. A "wider" (better?) version of Railton's position would distinguish the non-ontological property rightness from the natural property that plays the right- making role. Railton's response, included at the end of the Railton section, is that he has no objection to using the term 'property' in a non-ontological sense which individuates properties as finely as the descriptions we use to pick them out in thought, so long as we don't reify the extra "properties" that result. (120) This doesn't exactly resolve the original disagreement about the referents of our moral terms, but it nearly allows each author to endorse the other's words when given a suitable interpretation. If Parfit would be happy to think of his "non-ontological properties" as ways of thinking of properties full stop, we might go even further towards a full meeting of the two minds.

This may in fact be Parfit's considered view, as comes out in his discussion of Gibbard. For he reads Gibbard as allowing that there are two senses of each "fact" and "property," one extensional and the other description-fitting. This second sense of fact "means 'true thoughts' or 'the content of true thoughts.'" (90) And Parfit thinks Gibbard will agree that claims to normative and natural co-extensionality "would state a normative fact, in the sense of the content of a true normative thought, that was 'distinct from all natural facts.' This true thought would be about an irreducibly normative, non-natural fact." (90)

It thus looks like there is nothing more to a Parfitian non-ontological fact or property than the content of a thought. If, as it seems, Parfit's neo-Fregean theory of content includes the mode of presentation of a thought in the content of that thought, the distinction between coextensive natural and non-natural properties can be constituted by different ways of thinking of one and the same property, robust or otherwise. And this puts the difference between normative and non-normative properties in the mind. One and the same property (in a different sense) would then be normative or not, depending on how it is conceptualized. Gibbard's long response to Parfit, included in Volume III, offers something like this as a possible interpretation. He suggests that if "properties in the description-fitting sense" as used by Parfit is interpreted to mean what Gibbard means by "concept of a property," there is not all that much left to disagree over. (215)

Parfit is happy to agree that remaining disagreements are relatively minor. Gibbard's position would be better thought of as an expressivist version of cognitivism. (191, 234-37) A more robust notion of truth would secure that result. To be more than minimally true is to "get things right." To purport to get things right is constitutive of the cognitive, and so these judgments are cognitive. (234) This doesn't much undermine the interpretation of non-realist cognitivism as placing the natural/non-natural distinction in the realm of concepts while leaving reality, including normative reality, entirely as the opponents of non-naturalism thought it was. For worldly referents of our normative expressions play no obvious role in determining what getting it right comes to.

As noted, the last section of the book has Parfit confronting abstract but first order normative issues in the familiar style that made Reasons and Persons so thought provoking. Here, he engages with the work of Nagel, Sidgewick, De Lazari-Radek and Singer, as well as that of W. D. Ross. The arguments are vigorous. It isn't really a surprise that normative disagreement and deep puzzles haven't yielded to the hard thought and brilliant argument of Parfit and his interlocutors. These are hard issues, and we can often see that when we notice that our interlocutors offer what look like genuinely forceful reasons for the views with which we disagree. The discussion is no less valuable for that.

Similarly, meta-normative disagreement persists partly because we can bring various considerations to bear on the nature of normative reality and these considerations don't all seem to point to the same conclusion. For many of us, it was tension between various plausible considerations that got us doing meta-normative philosophy in the first place. This makes the concern with agreement by certain particular individuals a bit beside the point. Perhaps it is true that Bernard Williams had nothing to say about external reasons, and hence could not have disagreed with Parfit about the nature of such reasons (51). Still, Williams coined those terms to talk about the nature of all reasons and to claim that all reasons were internal. More important, really, is that he offered arguments worthy of consideration both in their original versions and as developed by others. Similarly, even if Alan Gibbard and Peter Railton come to view their differences with Parfit as minor, there are others who continue to find quasi-realism and naturalism of various sorts to be genuine alternatives to non-realist cognitivism, partly in response to the arguments developed by Gibbard and Railton.

Philosophy is hard enough, and disagreement sufficiently widespread, that we're not going to ease reasonable anxiety over peer disagreement by winning over all peers. Better, it seems to me, to take the measure of the arguments that come our way, to acknowledge their force, and to understand that, on most issues, the most powerful considerations don't all point in the same direction. Derek Parfit is sadly no longer with us to agree or disagree, but his life's work has presented us with lots of arguments -- many of them surprising, even troubling, and often also enlightening. These arguments remain to guide us and goad us as we do philosophy. That seems to me to matter quite a bit.


Dowell, J. L. and Sobel, D., (2017), "Advice for Non-Analytical Naturalists," in Kirchin (ed.) Reading Parfit: On What Matters, Routledge.

Singer, P. (ed.), (2017), Does Anything Really Matter?, Oxford University Press.


I benefitted greatly from reading Andrew Sepielli's review of the companion Singer volume in this journal, Kieran Setiya's review of both Singer and OWM III in the May 24, 2017, Times Literary Supplement, and the manuscript of Nicholas Laskowski's review of both volumes forthcoming in Ethics in January 2018, as well as from email conversations with Nick about that review and about Parfit. Reading and responding to David Copp's paper on Parfit's semantics at the Representation and Reality Conference in June 2017 in Vancouver BC along with followup conversations with him also helped me a lot. I also owe thanks to John Brunero, Stephanie Beardman, Jennifer McKitrick, Dylan Murray, and Shaun Nichols for helpful conversation as I was writing the review.

[1]His argument that properties cannot apply to themselves (80) would seem to rule out a different way of ending a regress.