Once-Told Tales: An Essay in Literary Aesthetics

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Peter Kivy, Once-Told Tales: An Essay in Literary Aesthetics, Wiley-Blackwell, 2011, 202pp., $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780470657676.

Reviewed by David Davies, McGill University


In the concluding paragraphs of this monograph, Peter Kivy anticipates that his principal theses "are . . . going to be treated, at best, with little enthusiasm, and, more likely, at worst, with downright hostility" (p. 163). What he might also have (correctly) anticipated is that readers who indeed require further convincing of his claims will arrive at this conclusion only after being thoroughly engaged by Kivy's stimulating treatment of his themes. Once-Told Tales, like the earlier The Performance of Reading, is a philosophical exploration of the silently read novel grounded in its author's own experience as a reader. The central claim of the earlier monograph -- that silently read literature is a performance art, with silent readings as performances -- is rehearsed in places in the new book, but is not crucial to the latter's principal theses. Rather, taking his own experience of generally reading novels only once as exemplifying the experience of many readers, he argues that the experience of such readers is a central explanandum for the philosophy of literature.

"Serious" readers, for Kivy, are distinguished by the kind of books they read and the importance they ascribe to reading as an activity (pp. 32ff.). The majority of serious readers, he claims, are either "in-it-for-the-story" readers, whose reading is motivated and sustained by an interest in the unfolding narrative, or "thoughtful" readers, who also concern themselves with more general themes -- philosophical, political or otherwise -- explored through the narrative. Neither kind of reader has reason to re-read a novel unless they have forgotten how the story goes. Kivy maintains that it is these kinds of serious readers -- term them "Kivian serious readers" -- that are of most interest to us as philosophers of art, rather than "structural" readers, who take account of and enjoy the structural properties of the novel, or "studious" readers, who read for some ulterior motive such as teaching.

Kivy further claims that Kivian serious readers differ from the "serious listeners" to absolute music who concern us as philosophers of music. Such listeners do seek out repeated auditions of a given work. This difference is something of which artists take account in fashioning their works. Even serious novelists generally write for the Kivian serious reader, whereas composers write for listeners who, they assume, will listen repeatedly to a piece. This, Kivy maintains, has significant but largely unremarked implications for the aesthetics of music and literature. Like many contemporary philosophers of art, he distinguishes between aesthetic properties and artistic properties, taking the former to comprise the sensuous, phenomenological, structural, and maybe emotional properties of artworks. Aesthetic properties, for Kivy, pertain to formal features of a work, while artistic properties may also encompass features of a work's content. Proper attention to the Kivian serious reader's engagement with the silently-read novel will, he claims, lead to a drastically reduced conception of the aesthetic dimensions of the novel relative to other art forms.

He supports this claim by considering three kinds of apparently aesthetic properties of novels to which a Kivian serious reader might attend. First, he maintains, the emotional experiences elicited by characters and events in a novel are matters of content rather than form, and are not properly thought of as aesthetic. Second, unlike serious listeners to absolute music who artistically attend, through repeated listenings, to those structural properties of works that carry the bulk of their aesthetic properties,

the perception or direct awareness of novelistic structure and its aesthetic properties plays little or no part in the novel reader's understanding, appreciation, and enjoyment of novels: even when the reader is a sensitive and sophisticated one, the novel a serious or even a great work of art (p. 30).

And third, unlike poetry, the prose language of the modern novel "is more or less transparent to the reader on ordinary reading, and thus, like novelistic structure, not in normal reading a direct object of artistic attention" (p. 71).

After developing these themes in the first five chapters of the book, Kivy dedicates the next three chapters to some old and new puzzles concerning our novel-reading experience. First, he argues that the difference between the temporally discontinuous nature of our normal reading experience and the temporally continuous nature of our normal experiential engagements with musical works is not merely contingent. The "gappiness" of novel-reading both generates suspense and allows readers to explore the novel's narrative and thematic meanings by recalling and reflecting upon those meanings while not immediately engaging with the text. Musical works, however, have no analogous content upon which listeners might reflect, and very few intended listeners would be able to remember the structural properties of the music were such "gaps" to occur. This helps to explain why the Kivian serious reader is not disturbed by the discontinuous nature of her reading experience whereas a parallel discontinuity would greatly disturb the serious listener. Second, Kivy examines 'Radford's problem' concerning our emotional responses to assumed fictions. He proposes a solution to this problem for cinema and theatre that relies on a notion of "unwilling suspension of disbelief". He more tentatively proposes an extension of this model to silently read novels, but also argues that novels are "in the emotion-arousing business far less than is usually made out" (p. 163). In the final chapter, he critically considers evolutionary explanations of our interest in being told new stories, and addresses some possible objections to his account. The book closes with a lengthy appendix defending his adherence to the form-content distinction against one of his critics.

Kivy draws productively throughout this book on his expertise both in the philosophy of music and in eighteenth- and nineteenth-century aesthetics, and the reader will be both entertained and enlightened by many of the details of the exposition. As noted above, he also draws significantly on his own experience as a consumer of literary fictions. He defends his methodology in the opening chapter and carefully indicates where his own experience as receiver of works plays a role in his arguments. One might question, however, whether this is always sufficient. For example, in defending his solution to Radford's problem for cinema, Kivy appeals to his own experience of having the "occurrent perceptual belief" (see below), in watching a film, of being "the onlooker to real characters and events before my very eyes" (p. 107). But this self-characterization seems to stand in need of philosophical defence or at least gloss given debates in film theory over the coherence of what Gregory Currie terms the "imagined observer hypothesis" -- the idea, to which Kivy seems to subscribe, that film viewers are rightly described as experiencing themselves as observers of the screened events.

Other more general questions bear upon Kivy's attempts to solve Radford's problem for cinema. He takes a solution to this problem -- how can fictions move us to genuine emotions if the latter have a necessary cognitive component? -- to require two apparently incompatible things: first, a belief in the characters and events in the fiction, as a necessary condition for feeling real emotions for them, and second, a disbelief in their reality to avoid the idea that we are under a persistent illusion. His proposed solution maintains that we can at a given time have both the dispositional belief that the characters and events in a film are fictional and the occurrent perceptual belief that they are real. The latter belief is one that we incur unwillingly, just as we unwillingly incur the perceptual belief that one line in the Müller-Lyer illusion is longer than the other even given our evidentially-based dispositional belief that the lines are of identical length.

Is it right, however, to talk here of perceptual belief rather than perceptual experience? Responding to such worries, Kivy offers a conjectural reading (p. 106) of a passage in Spinoza, according to which all perceptual experiences involve an "affirmation". Kivy interprets this as an occurrent belief in the veridicality of the experience. But it seems to me more plausible -- Spinoza exegesis aside -- to say that what is "affirmed" in perceptual experience is the content of the experience, not its veridicality. When, having measured the lines in the Müller-Lyer diagram, I look at them again, I still have the occurrent belief that they look to me to be the same, but surely there is no belief, occurrent or dispositional, that they are the same in length, but only an experience of them as the same in length. But this is a problem if a solution to the Radford problem for cinema requires an occurrent belief -- a 'perceptual' one -- in the veridicality of the experienced content.

In arguing for the relatively non-aesthetic nature of the novel as art form, Kivy attempts to reconcile this with his commitment to a non-autonomist view of the bearing of the ethical merits of a literary work on its artistic value. He does so by insisting that ethical value is not aesthetic value but, rather, a distinct contributor to artistic value. Challenged to say why we should take ethical value, if non-aesthetic, to contribute to artistic value, he seeks to shift the burden of proof to the objector, claiming that "for most of their history the fine arts have been understood as moral instruments: as major sources of moral knowledge and moral improvement" (p. 67). He further charges that it is only those under the baleful influence of aestheticism who would suggest otherwise.

It is important, however, to distinguish the following claims: (1) moral value has historically been viewed as an important value of artworks, and (2) moral value is part of a work's artistic value. For, as Kivy acknowledges, the modern concept of the artwork has itself been partly shaped by the very aestheticist concerns that he decries. Removing our aestheticist spectacles, we can identify artefacts, both in pre-nineteenth-century Western culture and in other cultures, that we classify as artworks although they had primary functions other than serving an 'artistic interest' in the modern sense. Quattrocento Italians, for example, would certainly have assumed that promoting faith was a crucial value in those quattrocento artefacts we take to be visual artworks. It doesn't follow, however, that furthering religious belief is properly viewed as part of such artefacts' artistic value. Kivy might, perhaps, simply dismiss such a notion of 'artistic value' as a legacy of aestheticism. But interestingly he himself insists that what bears on artistic value is not thetruth of the thematic claims of artworks, but their capacity to rewardingly engage those for whom such claims are a "live option" (pp. 50-51). Why, then, should we not adopt the same line in dealing with the ethical character of works? What contributes to artistic value, we might say, is not ethical value -- a matter of being ethically wrong or right -- but a work's capacity to engage the reader ethically through reflection on issues taken to be live options.

Let me conclude with a more general worry about Kivy's central claims. Is the one-time reader of a serious work of fiction -- or, indeed, of a lesser literary artwork -- able to appreciate it as an artwork? Kivy announces his theme to be "the art form known as the novel" (p. 2), and argues that the novel is a relatively non-aesthetic art (p. 163). We might assume, therefore, that he is concerned with the kind of reader who can appreciate a novel as a work belonging to that art form. And, indeed, in arguing that the Kivian serious reader is not usually immediately aware of a novel's structure, Kivy talks of not paying "artistic attention" to such matters, which again suggests that he is concerned with readers' engagement with novels as literary artworks. But, if so, his account appears to commit him to a view of the appreciation of literary artworks as such very different from a widely accepted view of what is involved in the appreciation of other kinds of artworks as such. For here, it seems, to appreciate something as an artwork requires that we attend not merely to a work's content but to the manner in which the artist has used the relevant medium or media in articulating that content. For example, challenges to the artistic pretensions of photography rest on the claim that an artistic interest in a representation is an interest in how the subject has been represented through use of the medium. And Jerrold Levinson's view that an artistic interest in a content-bearing manifold is an interest in "the way content is embodied in form, the way medium has been employed to convey content" is widely endorsed.[1] But, if we apply these general considerations to the silently read novel, it seems that appreciating a novel as a literary artwork requiresinter alia attention to how the novelist has used the medium to tell a given story, and thus explicit attention to the structuring of the narrative. While, as Kivy notes (p. 7), an author's superior grasp of her art can to some extent be registered by a serious reader on a single reading, the kind of "artistic interest" that Levinson describes seems to require more than this.

This is not to deny that the kind of reading elucidated by Kivy is necessary to appreciate a novel as an artwork, nor that "the author crafts the narrative novel with a view to the effect it will have on the reader the first time through" (p. 7). For to appreciate how an author has done something, we must first grasp what has been done, and the relevant qualities -- including the affective qualities -- of the content of a story may only be manifest in a reading that prescinds from concerns with structure and medium. Indeed, this applies more generally in the arts. To appreciate an impressionist painting, for example, one must experience the painting from an appropriate distance in order to register how the painter intended to affect the viewer through the distribution of pigment on canvas. Only then can an artistic interest in the painting lead to a closer scrutiny of means used to produce such an effect.

This might suggest that Kivian serious readers of "serious" novels fail to engage with them fully as works of literary art. If Kivy is right about the kind of "serious" musical listener of interest to the philosopher of art, then arguably the vast majority of listeners fail to be serious, because, in failing to attend systematically to musical structure, they cannot take a properly artistic interest in the music. But then should philosophers of art not perhaps be more concerned with serious "structural" readers than with Kivian serious readers on parallel grounds? However, this worry does not call into question the significance of Kivy's analysis if, as he very plausibly claims, it describes the reading experience of the vast majority of consumers of even serious literature. Nor does it diminish the importance of bringing to our attention neglected aspects of this experience and neglected puzzles to which it gives rise. Kivy is to be warmly commended for the originality and insight of his perspective on literature, and for the lively and engaging manner in which that perspective is developed. Philosophers interested in the complexity and significance of our reading experience will welcome this valuable contribution to our understanding of such matters.

[1] "Erotic art and pornographic pictures", Philosophy of Literature 29(1) (2005), pp. 228-40: p. 232.