Once upon a Time: Essays in the Philosophy of Literature

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Peter Kivy, Once upon a Time: Essays in the Philosophy of Literature, Aaron Meskin (ed.), Rowman and Littlefield, 2019, 127pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781786607355.

Reviewed by John Holliday, Stanford University


Peter Kivy is well known for his work in the philosophy of music, and his recent passing is undoubtedly felt in that domain. But later in his career, Kivy turned his focus to the philosophy of literature, with a special aim of defending the common reader, the regular folk who come to novels to be told a good story. This book continues that project; and while it does have the ordinary reader, knowledge acquisition via literature, and the importance of story as common themes, Kivy is clear in his preface that the chapters function as individual essays, each with an independent argument of its own. Thus, in this review, I will consider the chapters in turn. However, there are moments where arguments from one chapter lend a hand to arguments of another, and I will note these connections as well.

In chapter one, Kivy examines Plato and Aristotle's dispute over poetry. In the Republic, Plato argues that poets have no knowledge of forms and thus can provide no knowledge of things. In the Poetics, Aristotle offers a response, but one that is known to be problematic. Kivy's aim is to address these problems.

Put crudely, Aristotle's main claim is that whereas history deals in specific and actual events, poetry deals in general truths and probable events. Yet Aristotle also claims that poets rightly make use of historical figures, familiar stories, and actual events. Kivy's approach to resolving these apparent contradictions is multifaceted and impossible to do justice here. However, a major move he makes is to argue that "the believable is a kind of proof of the possible" (7), thereby making sense of why a poet, who deals in the general and probable, would appeal to history.

Kivy resolves Aristotle's issues in a tidy manner; but I will leave it to Aristotle scholars to determine how solid Kivy's resolution is, given that Kivy's future arguments neither build nor turn on his understanding of Aristotle. Literature's ability to confer knowledge, however, is a theme to which Kivy will return.

In chapter two, Kivy considers Noël Carroll's conversation thesis about art, as Kivy calls it, and extends Carroll's defense of intentionalism to aesthetic features. Carroll argues that when we experience art, "we enter a relationship with its creator that is roughly analogous to a conversation" (quoted, 14). Yet while it is clear how Carroll's thesis, if true, has traction in debates over the relevance of artist intent concerning matters of meaning and interpretation, it is unclear how it gains any purchase concerning strict aesthetic matters. With respect to the aesthetic interests of audiences, the anti-intentionalist argues that an artist's intentions are simply irrelevant. What matters in our aesthetic enjoyment of an artwork, says the anti-intentionalist, are the aesthetic features of that artwork and nothing more.

Kivy argues that if we consider notions of craft or skill, Carroll's conversation thesis can be extended to strict aesthetic matters. The aesthetic enjoyment of an artwork is, most often, an enjoyment of aesthetic features "as products of craft or skill" (21), which is also to say that we care that an artwork's aesthetic features are the product of intention, for craft and skill are, after all, intentional acts. We may, of course, find aesthetic enjoyment in aesthetic features we believe came about by mistake or incompetence; yet were we to come to believe that such features are the result of craft or skill, our enjoyment would be enhanced.

This much seems right to me. We do, as a matter of general fact, care about artists' skill and seeing that skill manifest in their artworks. But an anti-intentionalist can push back in at least two ways. (1) What we in fact do is distinct from what we should do in our appreciative practice. (2) Appreciating the craft or skill of an aesthetic feature is not, strictly speaking, aesthetic appreciation; it is part of the broader appreciation of art and its creation. Now, I think Kivy would not give (1) much weight, for in other work, he does not seem compelled by normative notions of appreciation that are disconnected from actual appreciative practice. As for (2), I am not sure what Kivy would say. I also believe that the pressure from (2) is not something that can be shrugged off so easily.

In chapter three, Kivy enters the debate over whether fictional literature can provide readers knowledge of the real world. Kivy notes that most readers assume it can and argues that these assumptions are correct. Consider Melville's Moby Dick and its famous chapter on cetology. Clearly it was Melville's intention to write facts about whales and whaling. It is thus, Kivy argues, a side effect of Melville's intention that readers gain knowledge about whales and whaling, a side effect that is itself intentional in the sense that it is not accidental or unanticipated. It is also, Kivy argues, an intention of the right kind, one concerning the novel qua novel. To see this is so, we need not look any further than historical practice. The practice of literature has always included imparting knowledge as one of its aims.

But Melville's intentions and readers' beliefs are only part of the puzzle. As I see it, the biggest hurdle for arguing that readers can acquire knowledge from fictional literature is explaining the justified in justified true belief. After all, fictional literature is just that: fictional. So if we are reading it for what it is, how can we extract any justified true beliefs about the real world? Kivy's answer is testimony. Since fiction is a form of testimony and sometimes that testimony is reliable, we are (sometimes) justified in the beliefs we form about the real world in virtue of reading fiction.

But Kivy's answer seems unsatisfactory on two related counts. First, I have trouble understanding why we should see fictional literature as a form of testimony. It is fiction. Now Kivy may just point me to the historical practice of literature and its aim of imparting knowledge. But that leads me to my second trouble: artistic license is at least as much part of the practice of fictional literature as are aims of imparting knowledge. Even authors of historical fiction may appeal to claims of "artistic license" when called on some incorrect matter of fact (see Holliday 2017); and claims of "artistic license" do not typically go hand-in-hand with reliable testimony. Of course, as Kivy claims (39), the accuracy of representations in novels often matter to the evaluation of novels. But evaluating the accuracy of a novel's representation and forming justified true beliefs in virtue of that representation are two distinct things.

In chapter four, Kivy does, however, have more to say on the issue of justification. First, he makes a qualification, claiming that "the 'knowledge' I am talking about here is what might better be termed 'putative knowledge' and its 'justification' rather 'putative justification'" (48). This, in a sense, addresses my worries about justification; yet the notion of 'putative justification' is not well-defined. If it is too weak, I am not sure why we should care; too strong, and I imagine my worries about justification remain.

Second, Kivy claims that authors of fictional literature -- along with journalists, historians, and physicians, among others -- are part of Western society's "knowledge-justification infrastructure" (53). Members of this infrastructure "are institutionally certified as reliable truth-tellers, ceteris paribus" (53). If correct, this would substantiate the claim that authors are sources of reliable testimony. To argue for this claim, Kivy again turns to history. Since the time of Plato, fictional literature has been taken to be a source of knowledge by the folk. Yet even if this point is granted, the folk do not put novelists in the same camp as journalists and historians with respect to society's knowledge-justification infrastructure. Kivy does say a bit about genre limiting which of a novel's statements we are justified in believing true, but he does not spend much time developing this line of thought.

In chapter five, Kivy switches his focus to story, the thing he believes to be the most important element of novels. While many philosophers of literature assume that formal and structural features of novels are to be prioritized in readers' appreciation of novels, Kivy aims to show that this assumption is mistaken. He has argued this line before. In his book Once-Told Tales (2011), he does so in depth. But his approach here is in some ways distinct.

What has not changed is Kivy's empirical approach. His primary path to supporting the claim that the story lies at the heart of novels is empirical. The story is simply what readers care about most. This is exhibited by the prominence of praising story in blurbs and reviews and by the fact that page-turners are the novels that sell most.

What has changed is that Kivy takes Peter Lamarque's The Opacity of Narrative (2014) as his foil. Lamarque argues that literary fictional narratives are opaque and that, as quoted in Kivy, "attention to [a work of fictional literature's] formal structure is especially appropriate and potentially rewarding" (63). Kivy acknowledges that while this a fine way to read, it is not the majority's way of reading. Kivy also advances the conjecture that while the novel used to be opaque, it is now, with its becoming commonplace, transparent, much in the way that rhymed couplets are opaque to us now and yet once were transparent, when they were commonplace.

But without some heavy theoretical assumptions, I am not sure there is much more we can get from the empirical fact that most people read and appreciate novels for their story than the empirical fact that most people read and appreciate novels for their story. Sure, this is an important fact; and story is clearly an important element of most novels. But I do not know who would dispute it. However, maybe this criticism misses the larger point, that here lies this undisputed empirical fact and yet philosophy of literature has not paid it much mind.

In chapter six, Kivy pushes this larger point exactly and attempts to address the question of why story is so important to human beings. Before providing his own answer, Kivy considers and rejects two other answers: (1) knowledge and (2) escapism. One might think that the pleasure we take in stories is predicated on the pleasure we take in acquiring knowledge. We like stories because we like knowledge and assume that stories can give us just that. But this thought does not seem in line with our reported reasons for seeking stories. A more promising idea is that we turn to stories to escape the real world. This does fit with a reason often given for enjoying stories. But many of the fictional worlds the average reader "escapes" to are worse than her own. So, Kivy claims, escapism itself cannot explain our deep-seated desire to be told a story.

Instead, Kivy argues that our desire for and enjoyment of stories must be innate, hard-wired as a product of natural selection. Kivy then goes on to offer an evolutionary explanation. An innate desire to be told a story, he suggests, would maximize the passing of practical knowledge from one generation to the next. Aware of the dangers of just-so stories, Kivy invites skepticism of his theorizing. But short of accepting some evolutionary account of our desire for stories, Kivy also thinks skeptics will not get far.

In chapter seven, Kivy defends his view that silent reading constitutes a performance. But the defense he offers is not merely distinct from the one he gives in his monograph The Performance of Reading (2006); it is incompatible with it. His goal is to defend against the objection that silent reading cannot be a performance because it is absurd to think that a silent reader can attend to how she is reading, to her so-called performance.

Kivy begins with the observation that most concertgoers do not attend to the performance but rather to the music itself. Attention to the performance is usually only given by critics or other musicians. Kivy then observes that it is extremely difficult for a musician to attend to her own performance while performing. Thus, Kivy argues, it is unsurprising that it would be extremely difficult for a silent reader to attend to her own silent reading; and thus that is no reason to reject the thesis that silent reading is a performance. Maybe so. But that there is, in principle, no one who can attend to a silent reader's reading distinguishes it from the musical cases Kivy discusses; and that distinction alone, in my mind, makes it odd to call silent reading a performance.

In the eighth and final chapter, Kivy shifts his focus once more, this time to jokes, specifically those characterized as immoral, those that promote racism, sexism, and the like. Kivy offers a view on which jokes are works of literature and their implied narrators' attitudes are what make immoral jokes immoral. Given this view, Kivy concludes that while

it would be a better world if denigrating religious, racial, and ethnic stereotypes did not exist, . . . we do live in a world in which the aforementioned stereotypes, alas, do exist. That being the case, it is a better world for the existence of jokes based on them and the innocent amusement and laughter they elicit. (115)

This final claim seems wildly wrong, as I can easily think of laughter elicited by racist and sexist jokes that is far from innocent. To be fair, Kivy hypothesizes that neither joke-teller nor joke-listener believe the stereotypes promoted by an immoral joke; only the implied narrator of the joke believes these things. Thus Kivy's conclusion of innocent amusement. But as with his conclusion, this hypothesis seems far off. As Jerrold Levinson has noted, the public exposition of immoral jokes "has an unmistakable normalizing force. That is, it helps make the thoughts involved in such jokes 'everyday,' 'ordinary,' even 'banal,' hence more readily thinkable and expressible. It is a way of domesticating the material that such jokes trade on" (2016, 88). That Kivy does not recognize this normalizing force is a deep, and somewhat unsettling, mistake.

Overall, Kivy's new collection is lively and ambitious. It puts pressure on the status quo within the philosophy of literature by hoisting the flag of the everyday reader. At times it makes bold moves, but the verve with which Kivy argues, despite my disagreements, is one of the collection's strengths. Anyone working within or adjacent to the philosophy of literature should have this book on her shelf.


Holliday, John. (2017) "The Puzzle of Factual Praise." Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 75, no. 2: 169-79.

Kivy, Peter. (2011) Once-Told Tales: An Essay in Literary Aesthetics. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell.

-- . (2006) The Performance of Reading: An Essay in the Philosophy of Literature. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell.

Lamarque, Peter. (2014) The Opacity of Narrative. London: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers.

Levinson, Jerrold. (2016) "Immoral Jokes." In Aesthetic Pursuits: Essays in the Philosophy of Art, 83-97. Oxford: Oxford University Press.