One Foot in the Finite: Melville's Realism Reclaimed

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K. L. Evans, One Foot in the Finite: Melville's Realism Reclaimed, Northwestern University Press, 2018, 210pp., $34.95 (pbk.), ISBN 9780810136120.

Reviewed by Gary Shapiro, University of Richmond


Recently there has been an explosion of Anglophone philosophical interest in Herman Melville. The author of Moby Dick, or the Whale (1851) was neglected until the Melville renaissance that began among literary critics and historians in the 1920s and that has grown steadily since. However, it is only recently that those working in the analytical philosophical vein have turned their attention to the writer. Others writing in English with a more continental orientation have produced several monographs and essay collections in just the last three years or so. These studies were preceded some decades ago by a number of European thinkers, such as Gilles Deleuze, Jacques RanciƩre, and Giorgio Agamben. Evans's book should be of great interest to those seeking a strong interpretation of Melville's great novel and to those exploring the value of Wittgenstein's thought for literary analysis.

Evans focuses specifically on Moby Dick. As her title suggests, she is interested in reclaiming Melville's realism. In a larger sense, she joins in an effort to reclaim American literature for philosophy, a project identified most frequently, but not exclusively, with the work of Stanley Cavell. She advances a Wittgensteinian reading of the novel, claiming that Melville "in effect lays out a solution to the problem that has vexed philosophy since its inception -- the problem of how we grasp thought" (118) or (just a bit more modestly) that he dissolves the Cartesian problem of bridging "the ontological chasm between nonspatiotemporal thoughts and spatiotemporally bound thinkers" (164). While Evans devotes about as much time to explaining her version of Wittgenstein's philosophy of language, knowledge, and reality as to explicating and commenting on Melville's text, she does offer a number of distinctive readings of the latter inspired by the former analysis. This book offers an original understanding of Melville's realism and argues that, so understood, the novel is quite coherent, contrary to many critics who regard it as a poorly patched together combination of a realistic whaling narrative and a metaphysical tragedy.

Evans comments acutely on a signature philosophical passage in Moby Dick that compares a whaling vessel hauling along two dead whales, one on each side, and so precariously balancing itself, to a thinker attempting to juggle Locke and Kant (chapter 73). Nominalistic empiricism competes with the transcendental a priori: is our knowledge limited to the things of sense, or do we possess concepts and forms of intuition that invariably structure our experience while rendering the noumenal world inaccessible? The narrator comments on the plight of those who "for ever keep trimming boat" as they compensate for a tilt toward one by hoisting up the other side. Evans endorses the narrator's exclamation: "Oh, ye foolish! Throw all these thunderheads overboard, and then you will float light and right." Melville, as read through Evans's take on Wittgenstein, recognizes that our concepts are embedded in common forms of life, elements of a rich and complex network of habits, customs, practices, and institutions. The "living whale in his full majesty and significance" -- a phrase that Evans repeats with increasing resonance -- is not to be reduced either to a set of sensible experiences nor to the idea that a single person might form of the cetacean. The whale is the object of those forms of life practiced by whalemen who pursue, catch, slaughter, process, and are sometimes the victim of the leviathan.

Throughout, Evans engages in a running discussion with a number of Wittgenstein's leading interpreters and commentators. She is particularly partial to Bernard Harrison's explication of meaning as use and the concept of language games. Evans suggests a continuity which has not always been apparent between the "logical space" of the Tractatus and the Investigations's focus on use. In clarifying this project, she observes -- rightly, I believe -- that it is misleading to reduce Wittgenstein's meaningful "facts" to mere "things," as the Pears and McGuiness Tractatus translation tends to do. Literary scholars inspired by (say) Cavell's readings of Emerson and Thoreau should find these analyses, which are bolstered by discussions in the extensive notes, especially helpful. Philosophers who are in the current Wittgenstein loop may find them a bit repetitious, while others less conversant with relatively recent relevant discussions may be grateful for them.

Evans reads Melville's essay "Hawthorne and his Mosses" as sketching a philosophy of writing that helps to save him from the charge that Moby Dick is botched, confused, or fails to cohere. There Melville praises the "blackness" of great authors like Shakespeare. As she rightly observes, he does not mean -- as some critics have thought -- the depiction of evil and disaster. Rather, blackness is the frame or background through which the author, as Melville writes, keeps much in deliberate obscurity and allows "those deep far-away things in him; those occasional flashings-forth of intuitive Truth in him; those short, quick probings at the very axis of reality" to appear with the force "that makes Shakespeare, Shakespeare" (63). Specifically, Evans adds it is such blackness that enables the creation of characters as figures.

Evans makes good use of the literary scholar and theorist Erich Auerbach's thought concerning mimesis and figura. While Evans sees Melville as among the great realists who represent experience in what Auerbach calls its "unique, contingent, ephemeral this-worldliness," his is not the "dingy realism" disparaged by Henry James. Moby Dick is as much romance as realism (5). Taking a suggestion from Auerbach, Evans encourages us to see each of the novel's main characters as a "figure . . . who, for all his or her individuality, also embodies a rigorous doctrine" (66). The leading characters are re-evaluated: Ishmael is a dreamy "young Platonist," disconnected from the world; Starbuck is a narrow-minded empiricist; and Ahab alone shows philosophical penetration in understanding that meaning is use and discerning the "third realm" of concepts (cf. Frege) in addition to sensible things and subjective ideas. Perhaps a more specifically philosophical precedent is relevant here: Diogenes Laertius' Lives of the Philosophers, in which thinkers are portrayed as performing their thoughts in situations of daily life. In commenting on Ishmael, Evans draws on the Biblical sense of the name as suggesting an outcast or exile, what Melville calls an "isolato" (he also says that all the ship's crew are isolatoes). This is plausible, but leads to such questions as whether Ahab -- named after a notoriously evil king of Israel -- should also be understood in terms of his name. That in turn gives rise to the Platonic query whether the wiser person is also the ethically better one. Indeed, Evans's frequent deployment of Plato provokes this reader to imagine a contrast of Ahab with the ship's wise captain in the Republic. Not only Moby Dick, but also Melville's other writings abound in descriptions of thoughtless, weak, criminal, or incompetent captains. If the Pequod is a political microcosm and Ahab is the most clear-headed aboard, in so far as he understands the "third realm," what does this suggest about the American ship of state? While superior to mere moneygrubbers (like Starbuck), could he foreshadow a leader who embarks on a disastrous war of choice from misplaced motives of revenge?

Giorgio Agamben, one of Melville's acute European readers, would most likely be struck, like Evans, by the author's invocation of the power of blackness. In the spirit of Agamben's essay on "Bartleby," he might understand blackness as sheer potential, the ability to not do and not act which the clerk relies on in his refrain of "I prefer not to." In consistently distancing himself from the common understandings that give meaning to human endeavors, perhaps Bartleby shows what it means to refuse elements of the most basic human framework. One side of Melville's "Hawthorne" essay that Evans does not develop has to do with his ambitions for an original American literature. That theme is of great interest to those readers who see Melville as dealing with slavery (e.g. "Benito Cereno"), perverse salesmanship (The Confidence Man), or the deadening routine of office work ("Bartleby, the Scrivener").

Ahab sees his pursuit of the white whale as a cosmic drama, one that Melville articulates through allusions to such Biblical passages as those in which God reminds Job that he cannot comprehend the leviathan or the story of Jonah on which Father Mapple preaches. Evans suggests that Ahab is an "unreconciled, unyielding Job," who can struggle with God because, unlike his predecessor, he knows that the meaning of concepts like "whale" is something much more than his idiosyncratic and private idea. It is a strength of the book that despite -- or in virtue of -- its manifest focus on language and meaning, it grapples with the theological dimensions of the great whaling saga.

Evans circumspectly limits her analysis for the most part to Moby Dick. Assuming we accept the general lines of her reading, we wonder to what extent it can be extended to Melville's other works. A few years after his masterwork, he published a collection of stories, The Piazza Tales, whose title piece suggests a perspectivist epistemology. The famous story of "Bartleby" seems to play off the eccentric clerk against his conventional employer, with neither being able to fully enter into the practices and habits of the other; the narrator of "Benito Cereno" is another naif who is unable to read the signs of the hostage captain whose boat he boards; perhaps "The Encantadas" could be read as a reductio argument showing how those who seek or are cast into isolation become unmoored from the common network of language games. This series of options could of course be expanded by adding other Melville texts. Perhaps these diverse stories could be plausibly read as variations on Melville's realism as interpreted by Evans -- perhaps not. I simply suggest that Evans's reading of Moby Dick invites us to ask whether Melville has a more or less consistent philosophical orientation like the one Evans finds in Moby Dick, or if he might be best read, as Plato and Nietzsche often are, as having produced an array of possible philosophical perspectives in a series of texts.