One True Logic: A Monist Manifesto

One True Logic

Owen Griffiths and A.C. Paseau, One True Logic: A Monist Manifesto, Oxford University Press, 2022, 272pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198829713.

Reviewed by Erik Stei, Utrecht University


Philosophers of logic have become increasingly interested in the question of how many of the multitude of available logics give a correct, or true, account of deductive validity. In their monograph One True Logic, Owen Griffiths and A.C. Paseau argue that the answer has to be: exactly one. They argue, further, that any candidate for the One True Logic (OTL) has to satisfy what they call the “L∞g∞s Hypothesis”: the OTL has to be maximally infinitary in the sense that it allows disjunctions and conjunctions over any number of formulas, as well as quantification over any number of argument places.

One True Logic is a bold and original book. Its discussion of foundational questions about logic is detailed and mathematically rigorous. At the same time, it is admirably clear and approachable. It is also fun to read. Its uncompromising style—the subtitle “A Monist Manifesto” is not an empty promise—its precise argumentation, and its dialectical clarity make it an engaging and thought-provoking investigation into the nature of logical consequence.

The book has three parts. The first is concerned with the rejection of logical pluralism. The second develops an isomorphism invariance account of logic based on the Tarski-Sher thesis and motivates the L∞g∞s Hypothesis. The final part deals with objections to isomorphism invariance, defending it against other forms of invariantism as well as against worries concerning overgeneration or robustness. The book is full of original arguments worthy of discussion, but in this review, I will restrict my attention to the first two parts.

True logics

Griffiths and Paseau (G&P from hereon) take a logic to be a formal language and a semantics. The book’s outlook is entirely model-theoretic, so it’s worth flagging right at the start that proof-systems do not receive much attention—and neither do either epistemic or normative considerations related to reasoning understood as an activity. This is not a criticism. Given that G&P are concerned exclusively with formulating a theory of all logical relations, construed as worldly entities that are individuated extensionally, this is an entirely reasonable choice. The logical relations targeted by a logic in this sense are the implicational facts of Ec+, that is, of extensions (superscript “+”) of cleaned-up (subscript “c”) English (well, “E”).

Now, the central requirements for a logic L to be true are that L includes all the logical constants, provides a framework for doing mathematics, and captures all and only implicational facts of Ec+ (20–24). So, how are we to understand the claim that there is exactly one true logic?

It is helpful at this point to distinguish between vertical and horizontal “which is the right logic” questions (see Eklund 2012). The vertical question asks which types of expressions are to count as logical. For instance, do we consider modal operators to be logical? The horizontal question is concerned with how the language is to be interpreted once its logical constants are fixed. For instance, how does negation operate on admissible truth-values of sentences? In short, and brushing over many subtleties, the horizontal question concerns rival logics and the vertical question concerns extensions of logics.

One True Logic addresses both kinds of questions. The first part argues for monism on the horizontal dimension. The defense of the “L∞g∞s Hypothesis” in the second part provides a necessary condition for the OTL on the vertical dimension.

Against Logical Pluralism

The current debate on logical pluralism is primarily concerned with the horizontal dimension. Logical pluralists argue that logics usually considered to be rivals provide extensionally different but equally correct accounts of natural language consequence. This also holds for the proposals that are given serious consideration in the book: Jc Beall & Greg Restall’s (2000, 2006) modest pluralism and Stewart Shapiro’s (2014) eclectic pluralism.

One of the main differences between modest and eclectic pluralism is the number of logics classified as correct. Shapiro’s eclectic view is extremely permissive. As long as a logic is required in order to deal with some interesting mathematical structure, that logic is legitimate. Beall and Restall are more selective. Apart from being an admissible instance of their Generalized Tarski Thesis (GTT), [1] a logic’s judgments about consequence need to be necessary, normative, and formal (Beall and Restall 2006, 35). G&P’s rejection of both forms of pluralism is based on two major worries: (i) how can modest pluralists restrict the range of admissible logics and (ii) how can pluralists in general account for metalogical reasoning? I share G&P’s skepticism towards logical pluralism (Stei 2023) but, arguably, their discussion does not entirely settle the matter in favour of monism.

The first worry, addressing modest pluralism, is that Beall and Restall’s correctness or admissibility criteria for logics are unmotivated. The argument is based on the assessment that Beall and Restall motivate the requirements of formality, necessity, and normativity by appeal to tradition (39). But, G&P complain, there is no consensus on those criteria in the literature. Therefore, “Beall and Restall have stopped at an unmotivated point” (40).

This is a slightly bureaucratic complaint, though. Even if we agree with G&P’s assessment of Beall and Restall’s motivation, there may still be other motivations for modest pluralism that fare better. Take, for instance, versions of the view that drop the normativity constraint (Blake-Turner and Russell 2021), leaving only the GTT plus formality and necessity. These criteria are close enough to G&P’s own explication of logicality in terms of formality. One might think that anything that motivates the latter may motivate the former, too. And there may be further ways to motivate logicality criteria suitable to pluralism. Quite generally, undermining one possible motivation for a view does not necessarily undermine that view.

The second, more central, argument concerns metalogical reasoning. As G&P rightly point out, pluralists are engaged in all kinds of metalogical reasoning: “They may want to weigh up the virtues of different logics, they may want to discuss the properties of different logics, and they may want to offer arguments to convince the other logicians to be pluralists” (45). The question is which logics pluralists may rely on when engaged in such reasoning.

On a very demanding picture, pluralists may only use arguments that are valid in all correct logics. On Shapiro’s eclectic view, this would leave very few arguments—if any. Even on a moderate view like Beall and Restall’s, which endorses classical, intuitionistic, and relevant logic, the acceptable arguments would hardly allow for serious metalogical results.

On a less demanding picture, metalogical reasoning is carried out in one single logic. G&P suggest that this leads to inconsistencies in case some argument invalid in one of the correct logics is actually valid in the metalogic (52–53).

A more natural proposal is that the pluralist may help herself to all correct logics in the metatheory (55 FN 24, see also Shapiro 2014). Why not be pluralist “all the way up” and claim that a metalogical argument may be valid in one correct logic but invalid in another? G&P’s response is this: pluralists should be able to give an argument for logical pluralism in each of the correct logics. But this is an impossible task for the eclectic pluralist since some of the logics she endorses are incredibly weak. We also cannot limit ourselves to pluralism about stronger logics since Beall and Restall’s motivation for modest pluralism is flawed (but see above). So, the proposal fails.

It’s worth pausing here to examine the assumptions underlying these arguments. G&P contend that pluralists have to do (at least) two things: (i) carry out deductive metalogical reasoning and (ii) offer a justification of logical pluralism. I agree with both. But, crucially, this does not entail that pluralists must do (ii) by means of (i). In fact, pluralists typically do not intend to give a deductively valid argument for logical pluralism. Shapiro is quite explicit about his arguments for pluralism being “more like an inference to the best explanation” (Shapiro 2014, 168).

G&P counter that abduction inevitably involves deductive reasoning (56), so pluralists need a logic after all. But the problem of justifying deduction is independent of the monism/pluralism debate.[2] It’s not clear why it should prevent the pluralist, or the monist, from using abductive arguments.

Since the overall argument for pluralism is not supposed to be deductive in the first place, the pluralist is free to concede that a particular step in her argument for pluralism is not valid in some correct logic. This does not necessarily make it an unjustified step—justification may come in ways less demanding than deductive validity. As long as the premises are justified and there is some form of epistemic support from the premises to the conclusion, the conclusion may well be justified too.

That said, I think there are further reasons telling against pluralistic theories of logical consequence: they make implausible semantic claims about logical consequence, they give an uncharitable account of logical practice, they are inherently unstable due to normative constraints on deductive reasoning, and at least some of them rely on questionable arguments to the effect that logic is domain-dependent. This is not the place to discuss those worries (see Stei 2023 for details) but they provide independent support for G&P's monism on the horizontal dimension.

The LGS Hypothesis

Moving on to the vertical dimension, the “L∞g∞s Hypothesis” requires that the OTL have maximally infinitary sort. A logic’s sort is determined by the kinds of operations the logic allows on formulas of its language. Classical first-order logic (FOL) allows finite Boolean operations and finite blocks of quantifiers. Infinitary logics typically permit conjunctions and disjunctions of infinite length or quantification over an infinity of variables. The logic FOL∞∞ extends FOL in allowing both conjunctions and disjunctions (the first subscript ∞) as well as quantification (the second subscript ∞) over any cardinality whatsoever. G&P work within the framework of finite type theory (FTT), which extends FOL by allowing variables of all finite types and quantifiers over those variables. Accordingly, the infinitary FTT∞∞ they propose allows quantification over any number of relations of any finite type as well as Boolean operations on any number of formulas. This allows a more precise formulation of the L∞G∞S Hypothesis:

If OTL is a sublogic of FTT∞∞ then its sort is ∞∞.

G&P offer “bottom-up” (Chapter 5) and “top-down” (Chapter 6) arguments supporting that thesis.

Top-down and bottom-up arguments for the LGS Hypothesis

The top-down argument departs from G&P’s explication of logicality via formality. It is spelled out in terms of the Tarski-Sher thesis, which provides a criterion for the logicality of relations—that is of “worldly entities” in G&P’s terminology. In particular, a relation R is logical iff R is invariant under all isomorphisms of its underlying domain (Sher 1991). On the standard reading, R’s isomorphism invariance makes R an admissible candidate for a denotation of a logical constant (see e.g., Sher 2022, 37). G&P’s interpretation, however, is far more radical. Given that the aim is to provide a theory of all implicational facts, they require that the “OTL must contain logical constants for all the isomorphism-invariant relations over its models” (128). This necessary condition on OTL is one of the distinctive characteristics of G&P’s view. Due to the generality of the FTT framework, it means that any candidate for the OTL has a proper-class sized language. It also rules out FOL since not all isomorphism-invariant relations are expressible in FOL (129).

The argument for the infinitary sort of OTL is based on a version of McGee’s theorem, according to which “a relation is isomorphism invariant just when for any (non-zero) cardinal ê, its extension on a domain of size ê is expressible by a formula of FTT∞∞” (126–127). Vann McGee (1996) showed that, roughly put, the language FOL∞∞ defines all and only the first-order isomorphism-invariant operations. He then extended the result to operations of higher type, so this seems to corroborate the thesis that OTL needs to have maximally infinitary sort.

As Gil Sagi (2022) has pointed out, however, the top-down line of argument can be resisted: first, McGee’s result can be obtained by logics that are strictly weaker than FOL∞∞—in particular by logics that do not allow quantification over infinitely many variables. Secondly, Sort Logic “can express anything which is definable in set theory and expressible in infinitary logic without itself being infinitary” (Sagi 2022, 6), in particular, without requiring infinitary formulas. In short, the top-down argument does not force us to go infinitary in either direction. I don’t have much to add to this, so let us turn to the bottom-up arguments.

Recall that OTL must respect all implicational facts of cleaned-up English and its possible extensions Ec+. The bottom-up strategy does not appeal to top-down considerations like formality or topic-neutrality. Rather, it consists in showing that, for increasingly strong logics L, certain logically valid arguments of Ec+ are not valid-in-L. So, if L is to be a candidate for OTL, it must be extended.

G&P’s central arguments concern the Ec+-validity of arguments involving cardinality quantifiers of the form “there are ê many” for infinite ê. In a first step, it is argued that English is not compact. This is supported by the argument A from {There is at least one planet, There are at least two planets, …, There are at least n planets, …} to There are infinitely many planets. Given that the argument is logically valid—an assessment G&P meticulously defend—and that no finite subset of its premises entails the conclusion, the compact FOL cannot be the OTL. As G&P point out, however, this is not quite enough to vindicate the L∞g∞s Hypothesis. After all, second-order logic can accommodate A’s logical validity (103).

This is where the extensions requirement in Ec+ comes into play. It is motivated by the observation that logical theorizing is not merely concerned with logical consequence in languages we actually speak. It is supposed to be much more general than that, accommodating not only different languages but also their extensions. Languages change, after all, and we may want to cover an extension of English Ec(ê) containing a name for the cardinal ê and a corresponding quantifier, for instance. G&P admit that accounting for all possible extensions is too ambitious. So which extensions of cleaned-up English should be considered? We are not given precise criteria, but G&P suggest that “an extension should not leave English too far behind, if reasoned debate is to be had” (xxiv).

Now, G&P concede that English is a countable language. As such, it can “only define countably many quantifiers of the form ‘there are ê many’” (104). However, some extensions of English may contain names for all numbers up to and including any uncountable limit cardinal ê. In these extensions, an argument Aê (similar to A above) may be constructed that contains additional premises like There are at least 0 planets, There are at least 1 planets , …, and a conclusion There are at least ê planets (for all infinite limit cardinals ê). No sublogic of FTT∞∞ with less than maximally infinitary sort can underwrite the validity of Aê, since any such logic can only define a bounded number of cardinals (105). So, the OTL needs to have maximally infinitary sort.

Extensions such as these are substantial. Note that bottom-up arguments cannot appeal to the top-down observation that the relations in question are isomorphism-invariant. Rather, they have to rely on the judgements (i) that arguments like Aê are, indeed, logically valid, (ii) that the extensions of English in question are relevant to the project of defining constraints on the OTL, and (iii) that they do not “leave English too far behind”. I don’t mean to suggest that these judgements are necessarily problematic. It is worth noting, though, that without them the bottom-up arguments do not commit us to going beyond SOL. The extensions of English needed to establish the L∞g∞s Hypothesis carry substantive argumentative weight.

There are, figuratively speaking, infinitely more aspects of One True Logic that merit further discussion. It is a fascinating and rich book that is bound to inspire further research not only on the pluralism/monism debate and infinitary logics but on a whole range of foundational questions in the philosophy of logic.


I am grateful to Jc Beall, Gil Sagi, and Sebastian Speitel for helpful feedback on this review.


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Eklund, Matti (2012): The Multitude View on Logic. In: Restall, Greg & Russell, Gillian (eds.) New Waves in Philosophical Logic. Palgrave MacMillan, 217–240.

Beall Jc and Restall, Greg (2006) Logical Pluralism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

McGee, Vann (1996): Logical Operations. Journal of Philosophical Logic 25(6), 567–580.

Priest, Graham (2014): Revising Logic. In: Rush, Penelope (ed.) The Metaphysics of Logic. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 211–223.Russell, Gillian (2014)

Russell, Gillian (2014): Metaphysical Analyticity and the Epistemology of Logic. Philosophical Studies 171, 161–175.

Sagi, Gil (2022): One True Logic, by Owen Griffiths and A.C. Paseau. Mind. DOI: 10.1093/mind/fzad014

Shapiro, Stewart (2014): Varieties of Logic. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Sher, Gila (1991): The Bounds of Logic: A generalized viewpoint. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

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Stei, Erik (2023): Logical Pluralism and Logical Consequence. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

[1] “An argument is validx if and only if, in every casex in which the premises are true, so is the conclusion” (Beall and Restall 2006, 29).

[2] Also, nothing forces us to believe that logics have to be justified deductively—in fact, both monists (Priest 2014) and pluralists (Russell 2014) have argued to the contrary.