Only a Promise of Happiness: The Place of Beauty in a World of Art

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Alexander Nehamas, Only a Promise of Happiness: The Place of Beauty in a World of Art, Princeton University Press, 2007, 186pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691095219.

Reviewed by Martin Donougho, University of South Carolina-Columbia


In his new book Alexander Nehamas wishes to rehabilitate talk of beauty as a characteristic of art, in the face, first, of philosophical or modernist attempts to insulate art from ordinary concerns, and second, of resort to aesthetic judgment rather than passionate engagement with art, to a 'juridical' as opposed to a 'Platonic' approach. He contends (35) that beauty "is part of the everyday world of purpose and desire, history and contingency, subjectivity and incompleteness." His case for passion is made with passion.

A distinctive mark of the book is its self-consciously personal tone. I trust I may be allowed some personal reactions of my own -- a sense of puzzlement intended to be productive as much as critical. To begin with, surely I am not the only person to wonder about the implications of Stendhal's words -- from which Nehamas borrows his title -- "Beauty is only a promise of happiness." They come from chapter 17 of Stendhal's On Love, a chapter entitled "Beauty usurped (détrônée) by love": a footnote tells of how imagination may so possess the lover that even ugliness can become an object of his passion, a pockmarked face beloved on that very account. You could hardly say that 'Beauty' is here straightforwardly endorsed. Adorno -- a figure not mentioned in this otherwise wide-ranging book -- also favors Stendhal's apothegm, yet his dialectical approach can more easily accommodate discordance, unsightliness, or the shudder of the sublime. Nehamas by contrast adopts a quasi-Platonic stance: of wonder, of erotic fixation, a state rendered almost speechless in its act of avowal. Of course he must still argue for this stance. And he does so, over the course of five chapters in this elegantly (indeed, beautifully) turned out volume, which derives from the 2001 Tanner lectures at Yale.[1]

Nehamas takes "promise" as a positive invitation, though with a few strings: he is forced to concede the element of risk, disappointment, even of self-delusion (Swann's devastation at the wasted years of being obsessed with Odette, who wasn't even "his type," is cited late in the book). I confess to being moved as well as puzzled -- once again -- by the often rhapsodic tone. That no doubt stems in part from the original lecture format (Elaine Scarry is similarly high-flown in her 1998 Tanner lectures, On Beauty and Being Just) and perhaps also from his adopting a quasi-Nietzschean mode of direct address or challenge. Sometimes I wondered whether the author wasn't just suffering from what has been dubbed the "Stendhal (or Florence) syndrome" -- the disorientation, tears, or rapturous fatigue Stendhal reported afflicting viewers of masterpieces of Italian painting.[2] Yet on further reflection I'm sure we're meant to take the rhapsody and rapture seriously, if also not entirely straight -- Nehamas is a subtle writer and a master of disguise, playing by turns the role of technical philosopher, ardent lover, or practicing critic.

Chapter 1 attacks 'aesthetic disinterestedness,' a tendency Nehamas associates first of all with Kant, Schopenhauer, and Clive Bell, then with a modernist complexity which he sees as increasingly requiring critical intervention rather than everyday engagement. Linked with this separation of art from life is what chapter 2 labels the "juridicial" approach, as found in eighteenth-century criticism, for example, which evaluates and compares features common to various works. It is compared unfavorably with a Platonic approach to beauty as one of erotic engagement rather than studied removal. Nehamas opposes attempts to interpret a meaning beyond aesthetic appearance or out of the ordinary, though not it seems interpretive efforts that would belong to the erotic quest.[3] Thus on the one hand he bears witness to the little patch of red in Manet (I detect an allusion to Proust's "little patch of yellow" in Vermeer, and by extension the death of the aesthete Bergotte at the moment he feels this particular detail elude his grasp); an intrinsically ambiguous feature not sorted by Danto's interpretive fiat. Beauty lies in appearance and yet exceeds it. On the other hand he castigates what he sees as modernism's turn away from beauty, and announces (with Peter Schjeldahl, Dave Hickey, and several others from the 1990s) that 'Beauty is back.' Good news this may well be, but hardly new; and taken with the long gestation of the book (beginning with some articles in 2000 and the almost identical Tanner lectures of 2001) it leads to my third perplexity: why publish this now? To which I'll add a fourth if minor worry: Nehamas reads Kant's judgment of beauty as demanding agreement with the judge, and prefers a more genial invitation to the community of beauty, whereas you could take its modality to be an attempt to distinguish mere recommendation from something with more normative force (if without norms). "I think X beautiful, hence think you ought to as well; I put myself on the line here -- but let's talk … ."

Let me turn from Nehamas's aversions to his exemplars (remembering that for him beauty is individual, while argument can recommend or elucidate): As in 2000, his twin lodestars are Proust's In Search of Lost Time and Manet's Olympia (given that objects of love are always particular, we should perhaps not complain that e.g. music, film, or architecture are missing -- he does mention his favorite TV programs).

I too love Proust -- his novel at least -- though not volume 5, The Prisoner/Fugitive, a relentless study of possessiveness and cruelty (I recommend a beautiful film by Chantal Akerman -- La Captive, 2000 -- which almost makes the whole thing bearable). Nehamas's enthusiasm here seems odd -- my fifth puzzlement -- until you realize that he actually meant volume 6, Time Found Again, which does indeed redeem all. Since Nehamas is a meticulous as well as deliberately theatrical writer, I wondered whether the contrast of two models of possession -- we desire to have the beautiful object, yet ought not to make it exclusively our own, something Proust thinks artworks show us -- was not perhaps a sleight of hand. Who can tell? In any event, a more serious puzzle: the last volume finds Marcel resolving to embrace the multiple relations with his past experience in an aesthetic unity, and in short to write a novel -- the very one Nehamas claims (125, 165 note) we ourselves have been reading. Here I simply accept Joshua Landy's argument -- in his wonderfully rich Philosophy as Fiction: Self, Deception and Knowledge in Proust (Oxford, 2004), p. 38f. -- that Marcel cannot be the author of In Search of Lost Time, briefly, because the experiences cannot match, and the stylistic unity of particulars which Marcel, Proust, and Nehamas (134-35) all approve applies to the artwork, not to life. The objection may not be fatal, however, in that Nehamas has argued for the continuity (though not identity) of artwork and lifework (see The Art of Living [California, 1998]).

Of his second exemplar, Manet's Olympia, he declared in 2000, "I have recently come to see [it] as one of the world's great paintings," a view repeated in 2001 and 2007 with the proviso that this might tell us little about the painting but maybe a little about the author.[4] He takes advantage of the scholarship and criticism of Michael Fried, T.J. Clark, and Griselda Pollock, and reports that he has conducted a "complex affair" with the painting (or with Olympia, or with Victorine Meurent, Manet's preferred model[5]) over many years. In 2001 he confessed that "[m]y attention to the Olympia has literally changed the shape of my life" (222). Her challenging yet blasé stare is unlike conventional nudes or contemporary genres of photographic pornography, but reminds him rather of Byzantine icons, even of the Virgin. He makes the original suggestion that Manet painted Olympia as she might have looked to -- and at -- a photographer taking her picture (118); hence the cat, terrified by the photographic flash. (For my part, I can't rid my mind of one of the most amazing pictures in the "Regarding Beauty" show: Yasumasa Morimura's fantastic cross-undressing Portrait Futago, [1988] where incidentally the cat features as the Japanese paw-raised lucky charm! I wonder what Nehamas might do with that … .)

Nehamas confesses that he is not at all sure about the purity of his motives in fixating on Olympia, but goes on to argue that beauty neither depraves nor improves in any definite fashion. So how are we to decide questions as to the moral benefits of (beauty in) art, he asks, especially when the former is general, the latter individual? We are almost at the end of the book by now (134), and it is more than a tease then to be told that happiness -- if that is the proper aim of art -- lies in its mere promise. The last page mentions Oliver Twist, and we might well echo his "Please sir, I want some more."

[1] The book's pages have wide margins, often with illustrations, and are unencumbered by footnotes -- unlike the original Lectures -- yet the reader needs to be alerted to the discreet presence of endnotes. References there are to line numbers in the text, and one has to anticipate when to turn to the back, having then laboriously to count out the lines. All in the service of an unblemished text, perhaps, but I tend to feel wrong-footed (so to speak) by this procedure.

[2] Cited by Olga Viso in her catalogue essay for the eye-opening 1999 show at the Hirshhorn Museum, "Regarding Beauty": see "Beauty and its Dilemmas," Regarding Beauty: A View of the Late Twentieth Century (Hirshhorn Museum, 1999), pp. 86-133.

[3] That distinguishes his approach from Hans-Ulrich Gumbrecht's similar but anti-hermeneuticist pursuit of "presence," if not from another figure conspicuously lacking in the text, Stanley Cavell, whose focus on the Emersonian ordinary or on popular (or 'low') genres, attention to what in relation to the other person escapes easy capture, not to mention a self-conscious play of address, is not far removed from Nehamas's own practice.

[4] "The Place of Beauty and the Role of Value in the World of Art," Critical Quarterly 42/3 (2000), pp. 1-14, at 9; A Promise … , p. 217; Only a Promise … , p. 106.

[5] A last mini-puzzlement: Nehamas gets the spelling right in 2000, but not in the Tanner Lectures or here ('Meurend,' sic); on the spelling, and for a very different sort of obsession, see Eunice Lipton's remarkable, Alias Olympia: A Woman's Search for Manet's Notorious Model and Her Own Desire (Cornell, 1999), un-cited here.