Only Imagine: Fiction, Interpretation, and Imagination

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Kathleen Stock, Only Imagine: Fiction, Interpretation, and Imagination, Oxford University Press, 2017, 222 pp., $60.00, ISBN 9780198798347.

Reviewed by Jonathan Gilmore, City University of New York


A fundamental question in the philosophy of art is the nature of fictional content. Readers typically determine with ease what states of affairs hold in ordinary make-believe stories. But what makes those things "fictionally true"? And what principles govern our discovery of that content? Kathleen Stock develops a theory of "extreme intentionalism," the idea that what goes on in a fictional representation is supplied solely by what its author intended its reader to imagine.

As Stock acknowledges, this sort of view generates strong opposition among philosophers of art and almost knee-jerk dismissal among literary critics. But her rigorous defense of the theory, properly reconstructed, and her demonstration of its explanatory value in approaching a range of important questions in the philosophy of fiction and the nature of the imagination, show why it should be taken seriously. And, given the close connection between how we think about the content of fiction and that of other kinds of counterfactual representations (e.g., thought experiments, scientific models, mental simulations, and so on), Stock's framework has implications beyond problems in aesthetics.

In the first half of the book, Stock proposes, along the lines of Paul Grice, that the kind of intention that is instrumental in bringing about fictional content is a reflexive one. Her theory is that an author's utterance x has a given fictional content that p, if and only if the author utters x intending that: (i) x should cause the reader to imagine that p; (ii) the reader should recognize this intention; and, (iii) that recognition should function as part of the reader's reason to imagine that p. Yet, whereas Grice identified the purpose in communication as conveying beliefs about the world, later qualified to beliefs about the speaker, here the essential purpose attributed to fiction is to elicit imaginings, whatever else it may do. This theory has three components: intention, imagining, and fictional content.

On intention: without invoking a fully developed theory, Stock identifies certain dimensions of intentions that any account of their role (or lack thereof) in determining fictional content should endorse. These minimal commitments allow her to dispense with most of the familiar (if sometimes small-bore) objections raised against any actual intentionalist theory of fictional content: failed intentions, slips of the pen, counter-intentional readings, multiple creators, limits to readers' knowledge, post-hoc meanings, inadvertent genre-membership, and "Humpty-Dumptyism." All these, Stock convincingly argues, fail to be dispositive, relying as they do on implausibly inflated notions of the determinative power of intentions or uncharitable interpretations of what an actual intentionalist must be committed to.

On imagining: Stock introduces the term f-imagining to identify a species of propositional imagining. The relevant domain of such imagining is neither experiential (as in one's mental imagery of an apple) nor phenomenal (as in one's imagining seeing the apple). This restriction stems from Stock taking propositional imagining, but not other kinds, to be essential to engaging with a fiction: "Fictions, whatever other kind of imagining they call for, always call for propositional imagining" (p.26). This is, of course, controversial; for experiential and phenomenal imagining might be just what individuates the kind of imagining associated with fictions from kindred forms involving propositions such as supposing and hypothesizing. So, on the one hand, Stock proposes to identify a kind of imagining that can be determined exclusively by the recognition of the intentions of a fiction's author; on the other, this constraining of fiction-directed imagining to f-imagining seems to require excluding significant kinds of content from the scope of what pre-theoretically would seem to belong to the account's explanandum.

Leaving that concern aside, I think Stock's analysis substantially advances the project of understanding fictions as the product of reflexive intentions. However, I want to note a question that emerges when we treat such intentions as solely determining fictional content. Consider two scenarios. One is that a reader, because she recognizes an author's intention that she imagine that p, does so; the other is that the reader merely recognizes the intention without that causing her to engage in the correlative imagining. Has the author failed to create fictional content if the latter case obtains? Graham Greene intends certain tenets of his Roman Catholicism to be true in some of his novels; I recognize that intention -- discover that in the stories the tenets are presented as true -- without thereby imagining that the events of the novels are indeed shaped by anything owing to the divine. Has my imagining failed to conform to what is true in the story, or has Greene failed to make such things fictionally true?

The difficulty here is that one prima facie plausible intuition is that once we put aside some special cases, e.g., the attempt to represent metaphysically impossible states of affairs, it seems that authors can stipulate that anything be fictionally true. Yet, another plausible intuition is that the successful creation of such fictional content requires some sort of uptake by audiences. Without the latter, the author has, perhaps, succeeded in laying down only instructions or materials for the constitution of fictional truth -- but not created that content.

Stock can reply that if authors exclusively determine fictional truth, that doesn't render readers' responses irrelevant. For, as she notes, if an author intends her prescriptions to be successful, she would of course write in a way attuned to readers' capacities to understand the text, dispositions to imagine, and so on. Thus, a fully-committed intention that p be true in a fiction is usually tantamount to a successfully realized intention that p is true in the fiction. However, there is still a conceptual space between our recognizing that we are intended to imagine some proposition and our imagining it, no matter how automatically and effortlessly we move from one mental state to the other. This suggests that Stock's identification of an author's exclusive role in creating fictional content might depend on an unacknowledged background condition involving an indispensable role for readers as well.

A virtue of extreme intentionalism (EI) is that it dispenses with the inelegant caveats and apparent ad-hoc qualifications adopted by moderate, hypothetical, value-maximizing, and other competing forms of intentionalism (e.g, that an author's intentions determine a fiction's content only when they don't violate conventional sentence meaning). But the foregoing consideration suggests that this might be the case just because the theory bakes those qualifications into the precisification of the concepts of intention and f-imagination that it employs.

Nonetheless, Stock's approach accommodates what is plausible in those other theories without surrendering the central principle of EI. For her fundamental disagreement with the alternative approaches is that each presents itself as an exclusive account of what determines the meaning of a fictional text (or utterance), whereas she argues that each only exemplifies a potentially appropriate strategy for determining such meaning. Whether a given strategy is the right one -- the one that discloses the fictional content of a text -- depends on whether the text's author sanctions that strategy in her intentions. It is only, e.g., because authors in most contexts intend to use conventional sentence meaning straightforwardly that it is usually appropriate to interpret their texts in light of conventional sentence meaning.

On fictional content: of course, arguments against theories like EI often say that there are many sorts of meanings that can be attributed to fictions that the theory could not explain. Stock agrees, and sensibly resists greedily accounting for all kinds of literary "meaning" (a term whose ambiguity encourages some licentious critical practices). This narrowing of the domain of fictional content to what readers are intentionally caused to imagine makes her account stronger and its commitments more explicit and readily assessable. However, it may be that, so pruned, her account ends up talking past her putative opponents in the intentionalist camp, each of which advances its own proprietary notion of meaning.

A disagreement is clearer in comparing EI with approaches to truth in fiction that eschew any reference to authorial intentions, such as that developed by David Lewis based on possible world semantics. The problems with Lewis's theory are familiar. Still, here (and throughout), Stock's nuanced use of genuine literary works in place of philosophers' usually contrived illustrations of counterfactuals is not merely a decorative flourish to her formal argument, but exposes the limits of any possible worlds approach in systematizing our intuitions about fictions. Whatever Lewis demonstrated about the "truth in fiction," it is does not conform to a plausible rational reconstruction of conventional literary practices. A text representing a fictional world could be description by description identical to one representing a possible world, with literary dimensions such as genre considerations and symbolism supplying a content to the former that would be withheld from the latter.

In the end, Stock's theory is the product of a reflective equilibrium among (somewhat revisionary) conceptions of intention, imagination, and fictional truth. One way to assess its adequacy, beyond its internal consistency, is to consider its success in illuminating other adjacent but still significant philosophical questions about fiction. In the latter half of the book Stock shows how EI can provide satisfying answers to such questions. I'll briefly describe her approach to three: how fiction can have cognitive value; the explanation of imaginative resistance; and the nature of fiction.

In Chapter Four, Stock defends the possibility of testimony-in-fiction providing a reader with justified beliefs. Worries about the cognitive value of fiction often revolve around the platitude that fictions don't need to, and don't consistently, represent their contents truthfully; hence, even when some proposition in a text causes readers to form a true belief (about, e.g., life in the period in which a story is set), that belief tends to lack an appropriate justification. One defense of such cognitive value is to see fiction under some conditions as a form of testimony. Stock shows how actual intentionalism is better (perhaps exclusively) positioned to exploit this solution than are other quasi-intentionalist views. It alone identifies the source of that testimony in a way that is not dictated by our interests (e.g., in the value of the literary experience).

Stock then exploits that account of testimony in an explanation of the problem of imaginative resistance -- a comparative difficulty readers may have in imagining certain morally deviant fictional scenarios, e.g., one that presents a murder as justified because it prevented some minor inconvenience. One thought is that our resistance to imagining such a fictional state of affairs arises because of an inconsistency between what the fiction presents as the appropriate moral response to that scenario and how we would morally respond if it obtained in real life. Yet, this explanation has a problem: an author's choice of genre by which the situation is represented can influence the emergence and degree of such resistance. The events of, say, a farce can be successfully represented without inviting any moral concern even if they would indeed raise moral objections if encountered in real life or (supposing it to be possible) if represented via other genres. Here, Stock shows how EI can both explain imaginative resistance and its susceptibility to genre. As we saw in her earlier account of testimony, authors sometimes intend readers to engage in counterfactual imagining with the aim of causing them to adopt some dimension of those imaginings as beliefs. Imaginative resistance occurs, she proposes, only in the limited case when the reader discerns through pragmatic factors (inter alia, the choice of genre) that she is being asked to acquire a belief that, in fact, she cannot share.

Note that, despite taking recourse to the interdependent intentions of an author over what genre a fiction belongs to and what part of the fictional content is to be exported as belief, it isn't clear that this solution to imaginative resistance weighs in favor of EI. Anti- and moderate-intentionalists can agree that texts cause imaginative resistance through prescriptions to convert certain imaginings to beliefs while still rejecting EI. They just part ways with EI about the source of those prescriptions.

Finally, Stock proposes a theory of the nature of fiction. EI holds that an author instructs the reader of her work to imagine certain things, and the reflexive intentions that inform those prescriptions wholly determine the work's fictional truth. In Chapter Six, Stock draws on that theory to argue that what makes something a fiction is just its instantiation of such reflexively intended prescriptions. Here, Stock doesn't seek to define what makes a fictional work, but only a fictional utterance (whose function is to prescribe an imagining). This seems problematic if only because of the common intuition that some works are fictional, others not, and that we don't make such distinctions among individual utterances.

Nonetheless, her account of the relevant intentions involved in fictional content allows her to distinguish paradigm cases of fiction (e.g., novels) that prompt imaginings from other sorts of representations that might also happen to prompt imaginings, such as maps and pictures, but that would only awkwardly -- in light of a highly revisionary theory -- be taken to exemplify fictions. Kendall Walton famously advances such a revisionary theory, one that would potentially count among fictions even toy trucks, naturally occurring cracks in a rock that look like words, and the constellations. Stock shares Walton's characterization of a fiction as something constituted solely by the role it plays in imagining (or "make-believe"). She differs in adding a special constraint on the attribution of that role: its possession must follow from what the fiction's creator intended. Walton's extension of the concept of fiction in his theory gives it great explanatory power in showing how items in apparently quite disparate practices are employed in similarly structured activities of pretense. Stock's theory has a narrower domain but in virtue of that better coheres with ordinary usage and with such practices as holding authors to account for what they write.

Let me note here that, while earlier Stock eschews extending EI beyond prototypical fictions, such as novels, her theory of fiction productively applies to other media or vehicles of representation insofar as they permit reflexive intentions to elicit imaginings with particular propositional contents. Most pictures don't do this, but some -- such as those that are very schematic or illustrational -- can. This is an attractive feature of her account in that it makes sense of the intuition that the concept of a fiction is orthogonal to the various concepts and categories with which we individuate verbal, auditory, visual, and other kinds of representations.

A theorist who balks at the defense of EI would, of course, object to the adequacy of the above solutions to problems in fiction insofar as they depend on EI. However, the plausibility of Stock's application of EI to those related areas redounds to the main theory itself, convincing us of its broad coherence, explanatory resources, and far-reaching implications. For its breadth, systematic argument, and deliberate ground-up reconstruction of its concepts of imagination and truth-in-fiction, Stock's book should be read by anyone concerned with what determines the contents of stories.