Onto-Ethologies: The Animal Environments of Uexküll, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, and Deleuze

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Brett Buchanan, Onto-Ethologies: The Animal Environments of Uexküll, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, and Deleuze, State University of New York Press, 2008, 223pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780791476116.

Reviewed by Robert Vallier, DePaul University


In the last few years Continental philosophy, in various guises, has rediscovered life. Phenomenologists direct their attention to the lifeworld, and to the phenomena of life and living beings. Some poststructuralists "deconstruct" the difference between organic and inorganic, while others concern themselves with germinal and viroid life and propose various biophilosophies, and still others talk about life as that to which 'biopower' is directed. And most evidently, if we take recent book catalogues as an index, there is a great deal of interest in animality (here I don't refer to animal rights or ethics, which have also given rise to much reflection and debate, but rather the question of animal being) to think about the animal in itself, and about the original difference between animal and human being, thus in some way clarifying the special status of the latter which many, since Aristotle, have determined to be both rational and political. What so much -- it would be unfair to say all -- of this resuscitated interest has in common is a striking disregard for the sciences of life, all too easily dismissing them as predicated on an unreflected and non-philosophical concept of life, which, the standard narrative goes, is inevitably reduced to some form of (neo-)vitalism, (neo-)mechanism, or (neo-)finalism. That may or may not be true as a criticism of the life-sciences, but it certainly should not constitute an excuse to avoid a careful reading of and thoughtful engagement with their theoretical research and experimental findings, which seems so often to be symptomatic of this return to life.

It is precisely in this regard that Brett Buchanan's Onto-Ethologies marks a difference. As suggested by the subtitle ("The Animal Environments of Uexküll, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, and Deleuze"), Buchanan endeavors to show how the theoretical findings of the properly experimental work of one particular scientist -- the important Swiss biologist, Jakob von Uexküll, sometimes called "the father of ethology" -- made their way into and helped to shape the itineraries of three major Continental philosophers. This alone makes it a valuable contribution to the growing body of literature on life-philosophy generally, and animality in particular. Given that it is written with a great deal of clarity and attention to detail, the book will certainly repay careful study.

It is easy to forget in our day the radicality of the contribution that Uexküll made in his, which is why in the first chapter Buchanan examines Uexküll's life and work, situating him with respect to the historical and scientific context of his time. Darwin's notion of natural selection was still subject to much debate among biologists, and Uexküll himself worried that, as conceived by Darwin, the model relied far too heavily on causal mechanism and mechanistic (physical) laws of nature. By reducing biological processes to physical mechanisms, Darwin and others like him miss whatever is particular to biological life and thus eliminating vitalism. That Uexküll may have largely shared this objection, common to the many different schools of vitalism, does not by itself commit him to a vitalist position. On the contrary, as Buchanan argues, Uexküll was also quite critical of both the argument that held that some natural animating principle or force subtended all life, and the argument that contended that life was directed towards some end or telos. The major representative of the teleological camp was Baer, whose arguments against Darwinism had significant influence on Uexküll, as did his peculiar, morphological notion of teleology that each organism develops according to a plan. For Baer, this plan is neither some pregiven rational concept nor the presupposition of nature's purposiveness; the plan is grounded in the organism itself, and more precisely, on the specific arrangement of its components. Although this rings Kantian to our ears, Uexküll heard in it the announcement of a double path beyond Kant (by whom he is undeniably inspired): first, the role played by the animal body (and particularly its proprioreceptivity), and second, the relations of living beings to other objects they encounter. He altogether rejects the notion of purpose or purposiveness in nature. It's on the basis of this double path beyond Kant, on the one hand, and his arguments against mechanism, on the other, that he will be able to sketch out a notion of the plan that life follows. Central to this is his concept of the Umwelt, the environing or surrounding world, which proved to be the key to all his subsequent research and which was later influential for Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, Deleuze, and many others.

The animal has an Umwelt, surrounding and enclosing it, much like a soap bubble. Each animal has its own Umwelt, and one soap bubble may enclose many others within it or be enclosed in other, larger bubbles. Unlike Leibniz's monads, these bubbles have windows, or at least intersect and interact with each other in concrete ways. The Umwelt is not merely given, but rather produced by the animal through the functioning of its body, its sensory and instinctual apparatus, and the objects it encounters. Uexküll devotes years of his productive life to the study of the Umwelt, its formation, and how it constitutes a ground for understanding animal being. From this research, several astonishing examples emerge, most famously the behavior of the tick; but more than that, two major theoretical constructs also come to the fore. First, the plan of nature constitutes a kind of melody. An extensive musical metaphor or "theory of the music of life" runs throughout Uexküll's work, and later becomes important to Merleau-Ponty later on. Buchanan neatly summarizes and translates the metaphors, but misses an opportunity to return to and evaluate another philosophical source for Uexküll, namely, Leibniz. The soap bubbles may not be monads, but they exist in a kind of pre-established harmony in the composition of nature. It is this harmonious composition that constitutes the plan of nature, or better, the plan is a kind of musical score. Deleuze later characterized Uexküll as a "Spinozist of affects." Given this, it seems that the background of modern philosophy from Descartes to Kant would be a particularly fecund area to mine in order to understand better the rise of modern biology. Buchanan can't be faulted for not developing this background, for to do so would have doubled the manuscript. While some mention of it could have been helpful, the absence of it stands as an invitation to his readers to engage in further research in this direction.

The second major theoretical construct to emerge from Uexküll's research on the Umwelt is the notion of biosemiotics (Uexküll himself does not use this word, it is retrospectively assigned to him): the notion that animal behavior signifies, and that this signification differentially constitutes its Umwelt as a meaningful world for it (and in so far as signification is directed outwards, for others as well, others who are capable of interpreting the signs, be they other animals or humans). Buchanan does a fine job showing what biosemiotics is and how it is developed by Uexküll and his later readers. For me, this is one of the most interesting and exciting of Uexküll's contributions. Strangely, Buchanan never really returns to this notion in a comprehensive or thematic way. He alludes to it indirectly in the chapters on Heidegger when he speaks of language. But he doesn't take it up in the chapters on Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze, both of whom address the theme in significant ways. One could argue that Merleau-Ponty's second lecture course on Nature (replete with philosophical studies of Uexküll, Lorenz, Portmann, Driesch, and others) has as one of its principal axes of investigation the notion of biosemiotics and animal signification. Similarly, though Deleuze rejects the unitary organism in favor of multiplicities and rhizomes, symbiotes and hybrids, he relates the fragmentary elements of all of these differentially to one another to constitute a meaningful assemblage. In other words, differential elements signify. It seems to me that some version of biosemiotics would be useful for us to better understand how rhizomatic assemblages are structured. Were I asked to state one single criticism of Buchanan's book, it would be the general disappearance of this theme of biosemiotics after the first chapter. But once again, we can view this less a fault and more an invitation to his readers to think along with him the influence Uexküll's theoretical and experiential works have had on contemporary Continental philosophy.

Chapters two and three -- nearly half of the book -- are devoted to a very close reading of Heidegger's somewhat equivocal mention of and interest in Uexküll in his famous 1929/1930 lecture course, part of which is devoted to the question of animal being. In the lectures Uexküll made his infamous and oft-misunderstood claim that "the animal is poor in world." If a moment ago I singled out the greatest weakness of the book, I do not hesitate to add that the book's greatest strength is Buchanan's close, careful, and extraordinarily lucid reading of Heidegger. Both expert and novice will profit from Buchanan's reading, which moves in a habile manner from the texts from the early 1920s to Being and Time to the 29/30 course, while also passing through and critically commenting on the many biological thinkers whom Heidegger mentions during this very productive decade. It becomes quite clear that Heidegger's interest in animality is less to determine its essential being, which he always seems to leave in suspense, but rather in the notion of "world," so that he might clarify the fundamental existential structure of Dasein as "being-in-the-world" through a comparative study. The very close reading of the relevant sections of the 29/30 course is clear and sober, and instead of propagating "heideggerese," clarifies it, cautiously examining and explaining every substantive claim in light of both Heidegger's overall project during these years and Uexküll's contribution (especially his notion of the Umwelt) to that project. I believe that these two chapters will (or should) become a standard secondary source for all those who want to question and understand Heidegger's analytic of animality and its relation to Dasein. That said, Buchanan at one point contends that those (like Lowith, Sartre, Jonas, and Merleau-Ponty, to name just a few) who have rued that Heidegger pays scant heed to the body in Being and Time would gain much from close attention to what he says of animal being. I am not yet quite convinced by that claim. Certainly they would gain something, but the human body and embodiment, is qualitatively different from animality, and this difference is not simply a function of the degree and kind of world that Dasein has and is in, and in which animals are poor. Heidegger is always a bit cagey, I think, about the exact nature of that difference, and while Being and Time may be, as some claim, a wholly new and ontological description of embodiment, Heidegger does leave the originary structure of the body itself -- animal and human -- in suspense. Nonetheless, Buchanan's helpful clarification and interpretation will certainly contribute in productive ways to the on-going debate about the role of the body in Heidegger's thought.

The last two chapters are on Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze, respectively. They are far more restrained in terms of their scope and development. The chapter on Merleau-Ponty concerns the "Theme of the Animal Melody." It traces Uexküll's musical metaphors in Merleau-Ponty's itinerary, starting from The Structure of Behavior. Although Uexküll is mentioned only once in that book in passing, Buchanan artfully shows that his musical ideas play a key role in the development of the argument, following it through the second lecture course on Nature, but mostly skipping over it in The Phenomenology of Perception. As I said earlier, it would have been very useful for Buchanan to take up again the notion of biosemiotics, as Merleau-Ponty is quite keen on developing a "symbolism of the human body," which, were it not for his untimely demise, might have responded to the question that Heidegger leaves in suspense. But Buchanan also follows the echo of Uexküll's melody through the working notes of The Visible and the Invisible, proposing some ways in which these notions contribute to his last ontology. I might disagree with a number of points of Buchanan's reading of these notes and his characterization of Merleau-Ponty's project. However, this is not a failure of the book, but rather one of its finer values. It invites the reader into a critical dialogue with the texts in a way that has not been excessively overworked in the secondary literature. Such dialogue can only lead to new insights.

The chapter on Deleuze constitutes something like a foil, in that Deleuze explicitly and vigorously reinterprets, and sometimes even rejects, the central notions of Uexküll's thought. The soap bubble in which the animal is enclosed bursts, as Buchanan puts it, allowing Deleuze to develop a whole new apparatus for understanding animal being. The animal in its environment is a distinct animal and a distinct environment (and naturally the preposition "in" disappears completely), but rather as a hybrid or a rhizomatic apparatus.The being of the wasp can not be understood independently of the orchid, and it's not the case that the two beings are simply added together to form one compound being composed of two parts. Rather, the wasp and the orchid are a hybrid that is deployed across territories and milieus (a term that is also radically reinterpreted by Deleuze). If Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty remain close to Uexküll's thought, drawing inspiration for it and using it to advance their own itineraries, Deleuze transforms Uexküll's thought in order to create new concepts. Again, one might find something to disagree with in Buchanan's reading of Deleuze, but more importantly, one always finds something to think about (in this case, the transformation of Uexküllian concepts into Deleuzian notions, something I did not expect to find there). It generates discussion, and that is a mark of a good book.

All things considered, Buchanan's book is a compelling and interesting read that makes a real contribution to the growing interest in life-philosophy and living being, and will appeal not only to Continentalists for its insights, but also the Analytics for its clarity and careful construction, and to philosophers of science of all stripes for its careful and nuanced blend of scientific and philosophical writers.