Ontological Categories

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Javier Cumpa and Erwin Tegtmeier (eds.), Ontological Categories, Ontos, 2011, 234pp., $124.95 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380996.

Reviewed by Gary S. Rosenkrantz, University of North Carolina, Greensboro


Ontological Categories is part of a relatively new philosophical series, "EIDE Foundations of Ontology," under the Ontos Verlag imprint. The series editors are an impressive international team of ontologists: Javier Cumpa, Jorge Gracia, Jonathan Lowe, Peter Simons, and Erwin Tegtmeier. The series focuses on fundamental topics in classical, phenomenological, and analytical ontology. This third volume in the series, edited by Cumpa and Tegtmeier, is a collection of eight papers, arising out of a private ontology seminar held in Darmstadt during 2008. The volume is a welcome and valuable contribution to category studies, an area of metaphysics somewhat neglected in contemporary philosophical literature.

The eight papers in the volume, in the order in which they appear, are "Categoriality: Three Disputes Over the Structure of the World" (Cumpa), "Properties, Facts, and Complexity" (Herbert Hochberg), "Order, Direction, Logical Priority and Ontological Categories" (Ingvar Johansson), "Ontological Categories: Why Four are Better than Two" (Lowe), "Attribute Instances: The First Ontic Category" (Donald Mertz), "Ontological Categories, Latents and the Irrational" (Roberto Poli), "Categories and Categorial Entities" (Tegtmeier), and "Including these Categories in One's Ontology, Excluding those Categories: Some Reflections on the Role of a Principle of Acquaintance in Ontology" (Fred Wilson).

I am happy to report that the volume is a well integrated whole: the topics and arguments of the various papers intersect at many points and complement one another. Moreover, collectively, the eight papers certainly fulfill the aspiration of integrating classical, phenomenological, and analytical ontological perspectives. Indeed, taken individually, most of the papers, if not all, incorporate at least two of these perspectives, and a good number of them incorporate all three. To my mind, given the deep and rich historic philosophical connections among the classical, phenomenological, and analytical traditions, this aspiration is a laudable one. The book unfortunately lacks an analytical index, which would assist the reader in uncovering and appreciating the aforementioned philosophical connections, and generally enhance the volume's utility.

Three ontologies are prominently represented in the volume: substance, trope, and fact ontologies. An incompatible triad of propositions centrally figures in debates about these three ontologies. The first proposition in that triad, defended by philosophers in the Aristotelian tradition, is that [concrete individual] Substance is an irreducible category of being. The second proposition, defended by philosophers in the Humean tradition, is that Trope (Property Instance) is an irreducible category of being and substances can be either eliminated in favor of, or else reduced to, bundles of tropes; the third proposition, influenced by the work of the early Ludwig Wittgenstein, is that Fact (Obtaining State of Affairs) is an irreducible category of being and that substances can be either eliminated in favor of, or else reduced to, facts.

Lowe defends a neo-Aristotelian ontology consisting of four irreducible categories of being: (1) substances (or enduring objects); (2) kinds (which are instantiated by enduring objects and which more or less correspond to Aristotle's secondary substances, e.g., horseness); (3) attributes (which characterize enduring objects but cannot be said to be instantiated by them, e.g., greenness); and (4) tropes (which Lowe calls modes [of enduring objects]). Thus, Lowe's ontology includes two categories of universals, kinds and attributes, and two categories of particulars, objects and their modes. However, Lowe is skeptical of the existence of facts.

Poli seems open to accepting the reality of facts and irreducible substances, at least with respect to living organisms. Interestingly, he characterizes a living organism as an autopoietic system, which he describes as a self-referential system capable of reproducing the components of which it is composed. In addition, Poli favors the idea, attributed to Nicolai Hartmann, that the enterprise of ontological categorization is a provisional and progressive process, rather than the promulgation of an unchangeable eternal system. I find this idea attractive.

Cumpa's favored ontology posits facts as the fundamental entities. He is committed to the reality of substances and universals as entities having non-fundamental status.

Wilson is skeptical about the reality of objectively necessary causal connections and defends the Humean view that the laws of nature are reducible to exceptionless regularities. He connects Aristotle's and Kant's views about the nature of substances to their conceptions of causal activity and argues that a Humean account of substance is preferable to Aristotelian and Kantian accounts.

Hochberg is similarly skeptical about the reality of an unanalyzable sui generis relation of natural necessity which grounds natural laws, finding it mysterious. However, he suggests that an accidental generalization that Fs are Gs can be differentiated from a law-like generalization that Fs are Gs by identifying the latter with a general fact of the form 'All Fs are Gs', and the former with a set of conjunctions involving 'F' and 'G' (and not with a general fact). Bertrand Russell famously argued that no conjunction of the form 'x1 is (F & G) & x2 is (F & G) & x3 is (F & G) . . . ' is equivalent to a general fact of the form 'All Fs are Gs' on the ground that no such equivalence obtains without conjoining a general fact of the form 'x1, x2, x3, . . . are all of the Fs'. Moreover, Hochberg finds experiential acquaintance with general facts à la Russell more palatable than experiential acquaintance with causal facts. He also supports a Russellian version of the bundle theory of substance, according to which substances can be reduced to unanalyzable facts about compresent universal qualities (together with an individuating element, either a bare particular, haecceity, or particularity).

Hochberg emphasizes the ontological centrality of considerations of logical form and structure. For example, with respect to the ontological status of facts, he writes,

While facts are clearly entities "over and above" the entities that are the terms and attributes represented in descriptions of the fact, they can be said to be determined (specified) by the latter in that the latter suffice for a definite description of a purported fact. (p. 83)

According to his account, atomic facts (facts not having other facts as constituents) can be said to be complex in the sense that they have as constituents the entities which are the terms and attributes represented in their descriptions. Considerations of logical form and structure also figure centrally in Hochberg's solution to the version of Russell's paradox concerning the ostensible property of being non-self-exemplifying.

Mertz defends an ontology of irreducible "property instances" (commonly known as tropes). While he accepts the existence of substances, he argues that they can be reduced to bundles of tropes. Mertz also accepts the existence of universals and facts, arguing that they are ontologically dependent upon tropes.

Yet, none of the papers defending reductionist accounts of substance come to grips with a serious problem faced by such accounts, namely, the problem of analyzing the relations that unite the qualities of a substance, at a particular moment of time, and over a stretch of time. The acceptance of this unity as unanalyzed or primitive has all of the advantages of theft over honest toil, as Russell commented in an analogous context.

Johansson's paper is an intriguing treatment of a problem that appears to have been clearly stated for the first time by Russell. The problem is that of explaining the so-called sense, direction, or order of a relation, e.g., before. To solve this problem, the difference between a is before b and b is after a need not be explained. According to Johansson, Russell held that there is an identity between the former and the latter. Rather, the problem is to explain the difference between the propositions a is before b and b is before a. These are different propositions which have the same constituents. According to Russell, this difference is tantamount to a difference in the sense, direction, or order of the terms of the relation within the two propositions. But such a difference cannot be explained by a difference in the logical form or constituents of those propositions, since they are the same. Johansson's paper develops a novel account of such differences, an account that depends on considerations about ontological categories.

A number of the contributors address F. H. Bradley's vexing argument against the reality of relations, including Cumpa, Hochberg, Johansson, Lowe, and Mertz. According to Bradley's argument, if a relation, R, were to relate a to b, then a relation, R′, relating a and R would be needed, as well as a relation R′′ relating a and R′, and so on ad infinitum. Tegtimeier's careful discussion of Gustav Bergmann's ontology is also relevant to an assessment of Bradley's argument.

Both Tegtmeier and Lowe raise serious doubts about the Wittgensteinian idea that the combinatorics of things and facts can be used to define a system of categories. In Lowe's estimation:

A system of categorial ontology that takes states of affairs as basic and attempts to 'abstract' the categories to which the constituents of those states of affairs belong by reference to structural relations amongst them is, I suspect, doomed to failure -- at least if it aims at categorial uniqueness and absolutism (anti-relativism). (p. 121)

Tegtimeier powerfully argues as follows.

The combinatorics of things and facts cannot serve to define categories and develop a system of categories . . . if one attempts to define categories in accordance with Wittgenstein's view the result is circular. One would have to define, for example, being a particular by being combinable with universals of the first order and being a universal of the first order by being combinable with particulars . . . the failure of the attempt to get rid of categorial entities by reducing them to possibilities of combination naturally supports the claim . . . that categorial entities exist. (pp. 178-9)

In his classic paper "Universals", Frank Ramsey argued, among other things, that 'Socrates is wise' and "Wisdom is a characteristic of Socrates' express the very same proposition, and so, in principle, no philosophically significant distinction can be drawn between universals and particulars. Hochberg and Lowe discuss some of the implications of Ramsey's arguments for contemporary analytical ontology. Hochberg utilizes certain implications of Ramsey's line to criticize David Armstrong's postulation of conjunctive properties, while Lowe argues that his four-category ontology has the resources to successfully defend itself against Ramsey's argument.

The most expansive contribution is Cumpa's, whose lead-off paper is over fifty pages in length. It includes a wide-ranging, critical examination of historical and contemporary work on ontological categories. Some parts of this survey are useful, but other parts are rushed and inaccurate. For example, he writes

The calamitous idea that . . . entities . . . have to be hierarchically organized by a common generality, as if all of them belonged to the same genus is also a dominant belief in contemporary theories of categories. One can note it in the indiscriminate use of trees in the recent literature (see, among others, Hoffman & Rosenkrantz 1994: 16ff). (p. 57)

Cumpa's reference is to Joshua Hoffman and my Substance Among Other Categories. But Hoffman and I never imply that a system of ontological categorization must be hierarchically organized by a common generality or have a tree-like structure. Nonetheless, entities can be hierarchically organized by a common generality within a system having a tree-like structure and, indeed, many such systems are possible. In Substance Among Other Categories, Hoffman and I make use of one such possible system of ontological classification in their effort to construct an analysis of the concept of substance.

Cumpa's positive account of ontological categories can be characterized as a weakened version of combinatoric ontology. While he claims that combinatorial rules determine the exact number of categories, he does not make the stronger claim, criticized by Tegtimeier and Lowe in the passages cited earlier, that combinatorial rules define a system of categories. Moreover, Cumpa holds that although combinatorial rules can shed light on the exact number of categories, this exact number is unknowable. Although I certainly agree with Cumpa that an understanding of combinatorial rules is important to the study of categories, I have doubts about his argument for a weakened version of combinatoric ontology. My grounds for doubt are as follows.

To begin, Cumpa explicitly accepts a Principle of Acquaintance:

If one can give an account of what there is, it is on a firm foundation because there is something. To give an account, then, is to be acquainted with something. But one would not be able to be acquainted with anything, unless it has characteristics. One cannot give an account of a nothingness. We shall call these two commonsensical starting points in the theory of categories, Principle of Acquaintance and Principle of Exemplification. (p. 17)

Categories, we could say firstly, are examples with which we are directly acquainted in our ordinary experience. How many categories are there? I do not know. But I am sure that if there are more categories . . . then you will be able to be acquainted with them. (p. 43)

One's having experiential acquaintance of this kind with an item requires one's grasping an intrinsic characteristic of that item. Moreover, on pages 43 and 57, Cumpa distinguishes between acquaintance with categories and acquaintance with their combinatorial rules and laws, claiming that we are acquainted with entities of all these kinds. Yet, if Cumpa's belief that we have such experiential acquaintance with categories is correct, then it is not clear that he has more reason to believe that the exact number of categories is determined by the rules for combining categories, than he does to believe that the rules for combining categories are determined by the intrinsic characteristics of the categories so numbered. So, in the end, I did not find Cumpa's argument that combinatorial rules determine the exact number of categories persuasive.

Cumpa rejects the Aristotelian view that the fundamental ontological division is between substances and attributes. Rather, he maintains that the fundamental ontological division is between facts and their constituents. Cumpa plausibly argues that the relation of being a constituent is other than the relations of being a part and being a set-theoretical element. With respect to parthood, he ingeniously argues that parts must belong to a common ontological category in order to form a complex, whereas constituents which belong to different ontological categories can form a complex, e.g., a substance, x, and one of x's attributes, F, form a fact of the form 'x has F'. He describes a relation like being a constituent as "transcendental," echoing the terminology of Saint Thomas Aquinas. (Exemplification is another basic transcendental relation, in Cumpa's view, because it is "cross-categorial," i.e., capable of relating an entity of any category to a constituent of a fact.) With respect to elementhood, Cumpa insightfully argues that a fact cannot be identified with a set-theoretical object on the grounds that a set's elements, unlike a fact's constituents, need not stand in any unifying relation. In his view, facts cannot be said to have parts or elements, only constituents.

Cumpa argues that given its transcendental character, the relation of being a constituent must be bare, that is, lack an essential nature. I fail to see the force of this argument. Indeed, it strikes me that being a constituent has the following essential nature: being a relation, R, which an entity, x, of any kind possibly bears to a fact, F, such that if x bears R to F, then F is what it is at least partly in virtue of x's bearing R to F.

In Cumpa's view, "Given that being a constituent is bare, the relation between a constituent and a categorial property cannot be necessary." (p. 21). Thus, Cumpa accepts a controversial doctrine of categorial inessentialism. Other ontologists accept a contrary doctrine of categorial essentialism according to which a categorial property cannot be contingently exemplified.

Finally, strictly speaking, Cumpa's claim that the fundamental ontological division is between facts and their constituents cannot be correct. It is evident that the fundamental ontological division must be embodied in a pair of categories that are mutually exclusive, e.g., Concrete Entity and Abstract Entity. But since, given Cumpa's ontology, some facts are constituents of other facts, Fact and Constituent of a Fact are not a pair of mutually exclusive categories. In particular, a logically complex fact, e.g., that Obama is president and that Biden is vice-president, a fact of a sort that Cumpa explicitly accepts in his ontology, has at least two other facts as constituents. (According to Cumpa, the logical connective of conjunction is yet another constituent of such a conjunctive fact.) There also appear to be facts which, though not evidently logically complex, appear to have one or more other facts as constituents, for instance, the fact that Michelle Obama believes that Barak Obama is president, and the fact that some men are Greek entails that some Greeks are men. So, it seems to me that what Cumpa should have said, or meant to say (applying a principle of charity), is that on his account the fundamental ontological division is between facts and their non-fact constituents.