Ontological Proofs Today

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Miroslaw Szatkowski (ed.), Ontological Proofs Today, Ontos, 2012, 513pp., $190.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783110325881.

Reviewed by Kevin J. Harrelson, Ball State University


This is a volume of original contributions by twenty-one authors of international repute; each addresses some more or less contemporary problem concerning ontological arguments. The authors reflect an impressive diversity of method, style, and national origin. Many of them, e.g., Peter Van Inwagen and Richard Swinburne, are already well-known to Anglophone readers. Among the remaining contributors are a number of excellent logicians and formal ontologists. The volume is especially rich in formal semantics and ontology and in the application of this work to the more traditional premises and inferences associated with the Anselmian tradition. It also includes a dozen or so novel attempts to prove the existence of a deity, and closes with a detailed debate on this issue between Robert Maydole and Graham Oppy.

The volume's structure leaves something to be desired. Miroslaw Szatkowski provides an informative introduction but does not succeed in lending the book a coherent set of goals or organizing principles. He suggests (19) that the purpose of ontological arguments is to provide a proof of the existence of God, in the sense of a defense of certain religious practices or traditions. If this had been published in 1682 as opposed to 2012, the assumption would be uncontroversial. Fortunately, it has occurred to some of the contributors that arguments are interpersonal phenomena and that many today are skeptical about whether religious commitment is a proper subject of mathematical proof. On this skeptical view, the value of cultural relics such as Anselm's argument lies elsewhere than in apologetics. In this review, I will first discuss the contributions that appropriately address broader philosophical or cultural perspectives, and only then review the actual attempts, such as they are, to prove the existence of God. My focus will be on the essays by Marcin Tkaczyk, Van Inwagen, John Turri, and Swinburne, and the Maydole-Oppy debate.

Part II, "Interpretation of Old Ontological Proofs. God's Attributes,"  follows the introduction. One might expect from its title that the essays in it provide something of an historical background to the later sections, although this is the case only with two (Tkaczyk, Van Inwagen) of the five. The remaining three essays also do not, despite the title's suggestion, deal with classical questions about God's attributes. Two of them (by Jason Megill and by Megill and Amy Reagor) propose novel theistic arguments that happen to focus on a specific attribute, whereas the third essay offers an idiosyncratic analysis of an ontological argument.

The Megill essays would fit better in Part III, which carries a more accurate label of "New Ontological Proofs." It includes four additional essays that focus on arguments drawn from possible world semantics (Richard Gale), modal logic (E. J. Lowe), Gӧdelian considerations (Alexander Pruss), and causality (Uwe Meixner). Parts IV and V provide the most formal material, with contributions by an impressive range of international scholars in logic and semantics (Sergio Galvan, Szatkowski, Srećko Kovač, Stamatios Gerogiorgakis, and Anthony Anderson). Part VI concerns formal ontology, with essays by Paul Weingartner, Jerzy Perzanowski, Edward Nieznański, and Robert Maydole. Part VII presents the debate between Maydole and Oppy, an exchange that will appeal both to scholars in the philosophy of religion and to students pursuing advanced technical discussions of standard ontological arguments. The debate contains two essays from each participant, in which they resurrect the exchange between Anselm and Gaunilo about the analogy between a perfect being and a perfect island.

In addition to the book's rather opaque organization, the essays are littered with editorial lapses, typographical errors, and mistranslations. Part of this is surely a reasonable trade-off for a book with such diverse authors writing in different languages. But it is also easy to imagine that diligent editorial work could have improved the presentation, especially in those cases in which scholars have written, admirably, in a language other than their native or preferred one. An extreme case of editorial neglect is Reinhard Hiltscher's "Ratio Anselmi," which opens the purportedly historical section. Hiltscher's analysis of the ontological argument is hard to follow. It is not clear whether he means to refer to a particular version of the proof, such as Anselm's, or to something like the true Platonic form of ontological arguments. The situation is not helped by the fact that the essay follows the tradition (somewhat outdated even in Germany) of leaving all citations in the original language. Readers not fluent in Latin and German will make little headway, and even those with the required linguistic skill will struggle. Nonetheless I suspect that something important lies in the suggestion (72) that Anselm's argument should be read in the context of Monologion 69, which describes the human mind as 'imago dei'. What I am less certain of is exactly how Hiltscher wishes to argue that the references to the mind and conception in Proslogion 2-4 require this gloss.

The remaining essays in Part II are considerably more readable as separate pieces, although they do not present any coherent set of ideas as a collection. In "A Debate on God: Anselm, Aquinas and Scotus," Tkaczyk delivers the most deeply historical contribution to the volume. He proposes examining the titular triad in the interest of showing, via case study rather than proof, that even the formally valid ontological arguments "must not be judged as sound or as convincing" because "the existence of God is usually smuggled in a way into the premises" (113). Independent of his aim, Tkaczyk provides an extremely learned and informed account of various modal discoveries in Aristotle, Anselm, Scotus, and many others. His essay goes a long way towards filling a lacuna in the literature, since no one with the appropriate linguistic, historical, and logical acumen has yet provided a comprehensive overview in English of medieval thinking in the relevant areas. Especially welcome are the sections on Scotus's contributions to modal logic (133-9). According to Tkaczyk, Scotus broke with the Aristotelian tradition by introducing a concept of natural modality (135), and this affected how he interpreted the arguments of Anselm and Aquinas.

More interesting perhaps for the volume as a whole are Tkaczyk's concluding reflections, which bear on the aims and uses of ontological arguments as such. Tkaczyk considers all ontological arguments to be hypothetical exercises of a sort: "All those proofs prove is that God's existence is derivable within the confines of some ontologies" (140). Someone seriously questioning the existence of God would find little direction in ontological arguments, Tkaczyk reasons, because the ontologies employed are not less controversial than is the existence of God in the first place. Although he perhaps overstates the case, he nonetheless reaches a point to which many philosophers outside a somewhat narrow subset of natural theologians would assent: something like the existence of God cannot be established by formal argumentation, with the result that philosophers of religion should reason in a manner more attentive to method and context, not to mention that they should display a greater sensitivity to history and culture.

Van Inwagen's, "Three Versions of the Ontological Argument," is the second and final historical essay. Although he distinguishes three versions of ontological argument, his exposition is cleverly unified. The first section treats a 'Meinongian' argument, and he attributes to Anselm an admittedly loose sense of Meinongianism. I find this ascription to be fairly harmless (Anselm indeed relies upon a category of esse in intellectu), and can agree with the conclusion that "any attempt to reformulate the argument of Proslogion as an argument that does not presuppose two modes of existence must yield, if anything, an argument that is simply not Anselm's" (151). The issue then depends only on the author's independent (and not reproduced in the volume under review) rejection of "Meinongianism in any form" (151).

In the nexr section, Van Inwagen intervenes in an imagined debate between Descartes and Kant. He grants to Descartes that the modal specification of existence circumvents the old 'existence is not a property' objection (154). But he proceeds to save the criticism by introducing the notion (deduced from his rejection of Meinongianism) of an "anti-existential proposition" (156). This principle provides him with a counterexample to Descartes's premise: he can allow that the concept of a mountain includes existence, but deny that the proposition 'there are no mountains' is self-contradictory (156). The same reasoning applies to a supremely perfect being: a 'non-existent perfect being' might be contradictory, but the corresponding anti-existential proposition is not contradictory.

A more interesting discussion appears in Van Inwagen's subsequent rejection of modal ontological arguments, and has application well beyond that context. He introduces a notion of epistemic neutrality, which is a characteristic of any proposition the epistemic status of which is identical to the epistemic status of its denial: e.g., the number of stars in the Milky Way galaxy is even. His eventual conclusion is that no modal ontological argument "can serve as a vehicle by which one can pass from epistemic neutrality as regards its conclusion to warrant" (161). The import of such ontological arguments must, in the end, be such that even a very reasonable atheist or agnostic would in fact change her mind when presented with the proof. Van Inwagen concludes that ontological arguments are not successful in this sense, whatever formal virtues they otherwise possess.

A more general line of criticism that provides perspective for the volume appears in John Turri's excellent "Doomed to Fail: The Sad Epistemological Fate of Ontological Arguments." This essay, curiously, is near the end of the volume, in a section (VI) devoted to "Ontological Proofs and Formal Ontology." It nonetheless belongs in an introductory section, since it attacks the very idea of employing ontological proofs for standard argumentative ends within religio-philosophical discourse.

Turri begins with a reasonable postulate about the epistemic status of ontological arguments: the purported goal of such arguments is to enable inferential knowledge that God exists, and this by a deduction from non-empirical premises. His thesis is then that such a goal is unattainable "at least for beings like us" (413). The subsequent argument is both tidy and far-reaching. His major premise is that beings like us cannot have non-empirical knowledge that other intelligent beings exist. In other words, his starting point is strongly individualist and internalist. But he considers objections to his premise, arguing with both Putnam's content-externalism and Davidson's related theory. The crux of Turri's reply is that even were a theory like content externalism, viz., the view that conceptual contents require a causal connection to a community, true, it would not follow that we could know on non-empirical grounds that any other intelligent beings now exist. In that case we would know only that other people have at some point in time existed (416).

The second premise of Turri's argument asserts that if there is a sound ontological argument, then you can know non-empirically that another person, namely God, exists. It follows from these premises that there could be a successful ontological argument (for you) only if you are God, a conclusion shared on various interpretations (though Turri does not note the fact) by many proponents of ontological arguments.[1] While I applaud this argument and find the conclusion to be consistent with the best thinking on ontological arguments, it seems to me that Turri has sought to argue for too much. It is one thing to say that beings like us cannot have non-empirical knowledge of the existence of God, and yet another to claim that we cannot have non-empirical knowledge of the existence of intelligent humans or human communities. The latter seems to me to be the more ambitious thesis, and it would be unfortunate if the less ambitious thesis were to rest on it. Perhaps the argument could be reconstrued to show that we cannot have non-empirical knowledge of the existence of God, even if we could have non-empirical knowledge of the existence of other communities. In that case Turri could grant the externalism of Putnam or Davidson in a stronger sense, and yet define the parameters of such externalism so that a theistic conclusion would still not be achieved by conceptual exercises.

These essays by Tkaczyk, Turri, and Van Inwagen provide the broadest philosophical frame for the remainder of the volume. Despite the otherwise rather antiquated aims and methods, however, many of the other essays do succeed in presenting tantalizing logical exercises. Any reader interested in logic or philosophical theology will find lots to chew on, and in this review I will need to be selective about pursuing arguments in detail. Most of the proofs presented in these sections develop some historically prominent argument by applying them to more current logical systems.

Megill's first argument proposes two ontological arguments for the existence of an omniscient being, and then introduces the so-called Gap Problem, viz., the question of whether the entity referred to in this or that theistic argument is the same entity as that worshipped by any religious believer. This interesting question warrants more detailed consideration (not pursued in this volume) of the relationship between formal argumentation and belief, or between philosophy and religious practice. Nonetheless several of the authors acknowledge the problem; I will consider their essays before the others. Megill's two arguments appeal to an anti-Lewisian possible world semantics in order to show it is logically possible that an omniscient being exists. If that is the case, Megill argues, then it is reasonable (or at least not manifestly unreasonable) to believe that such an entity exists. The argument can be reproduced in a simple, informal form: consider a hypothetical world W that is exactly like the actual world but definitely lacks an omniscient being; it is logically possible that there is a world W* that is an exact duplicate of W but contains an omniscient being; it is also rational to believe that W* is numerically identical to the actual world. The reason for this last move is that Megill assumes that there is only one concrete possible world, and presumably we cannot tell whether that one world is W or W*, making it rational to believe either to be the case.

This argument inadvertently illustrates Tkaczyk's thesis that ontological arguments provide only analyses of the consequents of complex ontological hypotheses, and thus cannot offer any potentially convincing proofs of religious doctrines. Megill has succeeded in taking a postulate contentious even among formal ontologists (that there is only one possible concrete world) and arguing from it that we cannot know that such a world does not contain an omniscient being -- a very modest result by any calculation. Of course, Megill could argue that there are good reasons to believe his modal postulate over, say, Lewis's system. Even if such reasons were produced, however, it would only follow (by a sequence of contentious and abstract mini-implications) that the non-existence of God is not inferable from the best current modal logics. I suspect that even the most heavily invested secularists are not so ambitious as to be discouraged by this kind of result. Megill acknowledges the modest nature of his conclusion when he introduces (86) the Gap Problem: if his argument is successful, he has shown only that it is not irrational for a mathematical logician to believe that an omniscient being exists, and so he has not validated the practices of any religious community.

I forego discussion of the very formal argument put forth by Megill and Reagor ("A Modal Theistic Argument"), which intelligently updates an argument familiar from Descartes's Replies to Objections: that any possible being powerful enough to create itself must exist.[2] Instead I wish to gloss some of the arguments put forth in Part III, "New Ontological Proofs." Richard Gale's essay is called "More Modest Ontological Argument," but he nonetheless endeavors to close the gap in the Gap Problem. In other words, he intends to at least indicate how a purportedly modest ontological argument can be supplemented to meet apologetic goals. The modest argument appeals to an axiom borrowed from Lewis, namely that propositions have implicit free variables designating world-specificity. If I utter a sentence corresponding to some contingent proposition 'KJH writes a book on ontological arguments', the complete proposition would specify whether I indeed write such a book in the actual world, or only in some close possible world that I imagine at the time of utterance. Granting this axiom, Anselm does not succeed in isolating a contradiction in the fool's denial, because he does not specify which world is in question (166).

To circumvent this problem, Gale appeals to S5-based ontological arguments, which add the premise that a perfect being contains all of its properties essentially, so that there are no world-variations in regard to its properties. (NB: a more careful study of classical theologies would make it clear that this apparently avant-garde path was well trodden many centuries ago). Gale makes an important concession when he allows that the fool could easily claim that ontological arguments based on S5 beg the question by importing loaded modal intuitions. He then attempts to adjudicate this stalemate with a quasi-cosmological argument as follows: the Big Conjunctive Proposition (BCP) of the actual world (viz., the conjunct of all the true contingent propositions) has to have an explanation. To support this premise Gale offers a detailed proof of the principle of sufficient reason, and then concludes that if it is possible that there is an explanation for BCP, then it is necessary that there is an explanation for BCP. The scrupulous reader will wish to read this essay next to Megill's, since they proceed from opposed logical premises. In tandem, the essays again illustrate Tkaczyk's thesis about ontological proofs and their relevant ontological suppositions.

E. J. Lowe ("A New Modal Version of the Ontological Argument") offers an argument that hinges on the concepts of 'abstract' and 'concrete', and infers from the existence of necessary abstract beings (e.g., a particular number such as 181) that there must be a necessary concrete being -- et hoc dicimus Deum. Like most of the volume's arguments, it provides an interesting updated version of a familiar argument, in this case Leibniz's from eternal truths.

Uwe Meixner ("A Cosmo-Ontological Argument for the Existence of a First Cause -- Perhaps God") provides the volume's only foray into contemporary physics. He argues that no physical event, such as the Big Bang, can be a first cause. Only agents can be first causes, so if there were a Big Bang, it was caused by an agent. The crux of his argument lies in rejecting the principle that 'every physical event is caused by a physical event', a rejection that, Meixner admits (196), is axiomatic for him.

A counter to these interesting arguments, which draw mainly from Anselm, Descartes, Leibniz, or Gödel, appears in Richard Swinburne's compact Humean tour de force "What Kind of Necessary Being Could God Be?" Swinburne argues informally from very general philosophical considerations to the conclusion that existence (or non-existence) claims cannot entail contradictions. Beginning with apparently harmless, naturalistic accounts of meaning and inference, he derives a sense of 'logical necessity' and 'logical impossibility' in terms of sentential entailments. He then argues (352-4) that even Kripkean examples can be reduced to his account of logical necessity, and he applies this (now broad) framework to some purported existential claims. The conclusion is that, even in the case of mathematics, the negation of an isolated existential sentence cannot entail a contradiction.

In his conclusion Swinburne introduces a proportionately naturalistic sense of 'proposition' that would (if accepted) deter much Anselmian argumentation. Although he does not provide the supporting arguments, he asserts that talk about propositions can be reduced to talk about human sentences, and that we have no good reason to believe in propositions as independent entities. This move would discourage the search for a necessary existential proposition, and it would also limit the value of any logically necessary existential sentence (were there one, which there is not). Swinburne's actual aims in this section, however, are apologetic rather than destructive. He argues that were there necessary or impossible propositions, this would pose limitations on God. If, for instance, there were a timeless proposition expressed by the sentence 'God cannot both create me and not create me', then God's power would be limited. An account of propositions in terms of natural language, however, makes room for the kind of voluntarism that Swinburne supports in other publications.[3]

Parts IV and V present some original work in formal semantics and ontology. Much of it more explicitly follows Tkaczyk's suggestion that ontological arguments provide only analyses of particular ontologies. In most cases the inspiration derives from Gödel, Lewis, or both. Stamatios Gerogiorgakis offers a brief account of the relationship between S5 and some theological claims ("Does the Kind of Necessity which Is Represented by S5 Capture a Theologically Defensible Notion of Necessary Being?"). The highpoint of his article, in my estimation, is the Kant-inspired argument with which he closes. Using a cleverly constructed analogy about fictions within fictions, he infers that existence claims derived within a given ontological frame "never get really actual" (320), so long as the framework in question is symmetrical. His conclusion, however, is less decisive than Kant's own, because it leaves room for research into what are called 'asymmetrical ontological frames'.

A considerable amount of the work in this part of the book concerns potential semantics that would underwrite improved versions of Gӧdel's argument. Anthony Anderson ("Conceptual Modality and Ontological Argument") provides the basic impetus for this work.  He attempts to improve the case for Gödel by developing the notion of a positive property. The semantic framework of this argument is worked out in two contributions, Sergio Galvan's "Logic of Existence, Ontological Frames, Leibniz's and Gӧdel's Ontological Proofs", and Szatkowski's "Fully Free Semantics for Anderson-like Ontological Proofs"). These essays combine to provide roughly one hundred pages of heavily formalized argumentation, which I cannot attempt to summarize here. Anyone interested in the relationship between higher-order logics and ontological arguments will find plenty of important source material in this part of the book.

Part VIII contains a sequence of tightly argued exchanges between Robert Maydole and Graham Oppy, which is in some respects the highlight of the volume. Oppy ("Maydole on Ontological Arguments") begins by criticizing four arguments defended by Maydole in a previous publication.[4] They are: a reconstruction of Anselm's argument, a 'Descartes-Leibniz' argument, a modal argument, and an argument called the Temporal-Contingency argument. The last is a modified version of Aquinas's tertia via. Maydole ("Ontological Arguments Redux") replies to the criticisms. Oppy's "Response to Maydole" is next, and Maydole's "Reply to Oppy's Response to 'Ontological Redux'" closes the volume.

As in previous publications, Oppy is concerned largely with the persuasiveness of ontological arguments rather than their formal validity. His argumentative sympathies thus lie with Anselm's insipiens rather than with the Archbishop of Canterbury. Oppy's strategy is to show that if we begin with commitments reasonably assumed by Gaunilo (or some other opponent), ontological arguments will present no reasons to change our minds. In executing this strategy, he assumes two principles. First, an argument that is subject to a parody with an absurd conclusion cannot be persuasive. Second, an argument that could appear question-begging to someone beginning from opposed, but reasonable, premises is also unsuccessful.

With these principles in mind Oppy attacks the revised Anselmian argument by constructing a parallel case for the existence of a perfect island. Oppy's argument is the subject of an extended exchange between the two philosophers, in which they debate whether a specific premise of Maydole's (reconstruction of Anselm's) argument is preferable to the corresponding premise of Oppy's parody. The debate hinges, in the end (502), on the dubious question of whether every property essential to islands is a great-making property for islands -- or specifically on whether there are any compelling reasons to prefer the corresponding theological premise to this one.

In his attack on the remaining arguments, Oppy imagines a fool who begins with naturalistic premises, and considers whether such a fool should be convinced by Maydole's arguments. The Temporal-Contingency argument, for instance, would have to convince someone who believes that there is an uncaused necessary natural cause, or a regress of natural causes, or some similar hypothesis. Oppy then insists, quite reasonably, that even if Maydole has provided a valid ontological argument on non-naturalist premises, that argument would not be a convincing proof of God's existence from the standpoint of the naturalist.

It is clear that Szatkowski, has assembled a very impressive cast of characters to participate in debates relating to ontological arguments. The volume will be of tremendous use to anyone interested in contemporary ontological arguments, philosophical theology, or the relation between higher-order logic and the philosophy of religion. While the editorial lapses and lack of adequate historical perspective provide some considerable obstacles, the depth, sophistication, and sheer quantity of argument more than compensates for these and other shortcomings.

[1] See my The Ontological Argument from Descartes to Hegel (Humanity Books, 2009), p. 205.

[2] Descartes proposes an argument from omnipotence in his First Set of Replies.

[3] The Existence of God, second edition, (Oxford University Press, 2004).

[4] Robert E. Maydole, "The Ontological Argument" in The Blackwell Companion to Natural Theology, ed. W. L. Craig and J. P. Moreland, (Wiley-Blackwell, 2009), pp. 553-587.