Ontology after Carnap

Placeholder book cover

Stephan Blatti and Sandra Lapointe (eds.), Ontology after Carnap, Oxford University Press, 2016, 244pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199661985.

Reviewed by Tim Button, University of Cambridge


Stephan Blatti and Sandra Lapointe tell us that 'careful and sustained work in metaontology is a relatively recent phenomenon. The single most significant episode in the brief history of metaontological inquiry was the mid-twentieth century debate between' Rudolf Carnap and W.V.O. Quine (p.1). It will be sad if we forget works like Kant's Prolegomena or James's Pragmatism when we write metaontology's history. Still, the editors' remark is a clear point to the book's focus: metaontology in the light of recent interest in Carnap's 'Empiricism, Semantics and Ontology' (1950).

Carnap 1950 is at the centre of things, as that is where Carnap formulates his internal/external dichotomy. If you haven't already encountered the dichotomy, then neither this book nor this review is for you. Otherwise, read on (and consider obtaining the book).

Four positive neo-Carnapian proposals are on offer here: Thomas Hofweber, Eli Hirsch and Amie Thomasson elaborate on positions which they have been developing for some time, and Robert Kraut presents a new brand of expressivism. Alan Sidelle's and Matti Eklund's chapters stand out for their clear and systematic maps of the terrain. Stephen Biggs and Jessica Wilson, Simon Evnine, and Kathrin Koslicki raise specific criticisms of (neo)Carnapianism. And Richard Creath and Greg Lavers offer more historical contributions.

The editors' introduction includes a helpful chapter-by-chapter summary of the book.  So instead of offering a similar summary, I will try to tease out some of the book's themes, thereby giving some sense of contemporary neo-Carnapianianiam.


Carnap (1950, pp.32-3) tells us that the internal/external dichotomy has its roots in the Vienna Circle. Back in Vienna, he had dismissed (what he would later call) 'external statements' as nonsense. By 1950, he was more tolerant, suggesting that we could treat 'external statements' as proposals to adopt certain ways of speaking. He was clear that this was somewhat infelicitous, since 'external questions', understood in this way, 'cannot be identified with the [traditional] question of realism. They are not yes-no questions but questions of degree' (1950, p.24). And Sidelle (p.77) provides the right interpretation of all this: given his empiricism, Carnap struggled to make any sense of 'external statements', but the best sense he could make of them was to treat them as proposals.

But it's worth recalling this when considering how Carnap himself is handled in this book. For example, Hofweber (pp.21-2) dismisses Carnap's dichotomy, in part because metaphysicians actually do not present 'external statements' as proposals. Similarly, Kraut complains (p.36) that the 'revisionary Carnap . . . frustrates the Ontologist in us all'. These strike me as odd complaints to make, precisely because Carnap would not have regarded either as a complaint. As Creath explains (p.197), Carnap 'was under no illusion that either the traditional Platonist or the traditional nominalist would say "Oh yes, that is what I meant all along." They will not say this, because they understand themselves to be and mean themselves to be disagreeing with each other.'

Existence questions, and beyond

Having formulated his internal/external dichotomy, Carnap uses it to illuminate questions like 'Are there properties, classes, numbers, propositions?' (1950, p.21). It's worth noting, though, that there is more to metaphysics than such existence-questions. This is the point of Koslicki's paper. She focuses on debates about ontological dependence in trope theories, and establishes that 'a purely existential understanding of what is at issue' would not allow us to make sense of disagreements about ontological dependence (p.238).

All true. But, even if his 1950 paper is limited to existence-questions, there is no obvious reason for Carnap to limit his attention in this way. Indeed, Carnapians might well reply to Koslicki as follows: Set up any framework you like concerning 'ontological dependence'; just don't act as if there are truth-apt, external questions here. Koslicki's rival metaphysicians will doubtless be unhappy with this, but, as in §1, this constitutes no objection to Carnap.

Similar remarks apply to one of Sidelle's criticisms of Carnap (pp.68-70). Throughout his entire career, Carnap wanted to dissolve the debate between realism and subjective idealism. Now, Carnap characterises this as a debate about 'the external question of the reality of the thing world' (1950, p.22). According to Sidelle, though, the historical debate is better characterised as a disagreement about whether objects are mind-independent. Sidelle may well be right here. However, as above, I think Carnap could concede this point, whilst insisting: Set up any framework you like concerning 'mind-independence'; just don't act as if there are truth-apt, external questions here. (Cf. Button 2013, pp.65-7.)

Carnap and neo-Carnapians

I have begun by discussing Carnap himself. But most of the book focuses less on him than on various neo-Carnapians. Before we turn to them over the next four sections, it will be helpful to consider Sidelle's nice treatment of the several ways in which neo-Carnapians typically distance themselves from Carnap.

1. Scope. Carnap's internal/external dichotomy will allow us to brush aside almost all of metaphysics. Neo-Carnapians tend to focus on more specific disputes, like whether fusions exist (pp.61-2).

2. Formality. Carnap thinks that informal talk should be explicated using some formal framework, to which questions may be internal. Neo-Carnapians who speak of 'frameworks' rarely assume that they are particularly formalised (pp.62-4).

Sidelle tries to effect a 'rapprochement' between Carnap and neo-Carnapians, by invoking Carnap's empiricism (pp.64-7). However, this surely points to one of the biggest differences between Carnap and neo-Carnapians:

3. Empiricism. Carnap is an empiricist par excellence. Neo-Carnapians scarcely mention empiricism, let alone endorse it.

Eklund (p.176) and Sidelle (pp.78-9) both suggest, utterly convincingly, that Carnap's background empiricism explains why his 1950 contains no argument to convince the reader against 'embracing a Platonic ontology' (1950, p.21). As such, though, non-empiricist neo-Carnapians who want to win converts will have to supply some arguments.


Let's turn, then, to the neo-Carnapians in this book, starting with Hofweber. Hofweber takes from Carnap only the claim that there are two different ways to ask 'whether there are Fs' (p.14; cf. Eklund p.169). On the domain-conditions reading, we use quantifiers to 'make a claim about the domain of all objects'; on the inferential-role reading, we use them for their 'inferential role' (p.23). For Hofweber, only the domain-conditions reading is ontologically committing.

Plainly, this is not very Carnapian. Indeed, using the framework of §3: (1) Hofweber's scope is narrow in that, whilst he applies the two readings of the quantifier to any 'discourse', which reading is on display in a given discourse is 'a complex and substantial question' (p.28); (2) Hofweber has no special interest in formal discourses, claiming that both readings arise in ordinary communication; and (3) there is no sign of empiricism in Hofweber.

Hofweber's paper trails his 2016 book. Sadly, I couldn't glean much detail about his settled position from the paper alone. But I was left wondering why he wants to tie inferential role to the (only) ontologically non-committing reading of the quantifier.

Suppose, first, that we have a sound and complete inference system for our quantifiers. Then there is surely very little difference between using quantifiers to say what is 'in the domain' and using them for their 'inferential role'. But suppose, instead, that we lack a sound and complete inference system for our quantifiers. Then the 'inferential role' of the quantifiers cannot exhaust their meaning. So, in this case, Hofweber must think that the quantifiers have the 'domain-condition' reading, making them ontologically committing. But this leaves no space for philosophers (like Hellman 1989) who think that we should embrace full second-order logic (which has no sound and complete inference system) when doing arithmetic, whilst denying that numbers exist.


The next neo-Carnapian proposal is Kraut's. For him, to say 'there are Fs' is to express your commitment to the explanatory indispensability of F-talk. Kraut hopes that the focus on explanatory indispensability will allow him to conserve traditional ontological disputes, unchanged. But he also hopes to be able to clarify what is at stake in these disputes. For, according to Kraut, ontologists have been insufficiently clear about the meaning of 'exists'. (Kraut nicely supports this latter thought, by considering a 'No Exit' argument concerning quantification (pp.32-5, 53-5): whenever we try to explain the semantics for 'exists', we end up using existential notions.)

On the Carnapian metric from §3: (1) Kraut's scope is broad, since he wants to apply his expressivism to any ontological discourse; but (2) there is no specific focus on formal frameworks, and (3) there is no sign of empiricism.

Kraut's paper is engaging, and his idea is intriguing. However, I should voice two quick concerns. First, focussing on (explanatory) indispensability is characteristic of post-Quinean metaphysics. The role of indispensability in pre-Quinean metaphysics is less clear, and it is correspondingly unclear whether Kraut can conserve pre-Quinean metaphysical disputes. Second, consider the claim that some things exist which aren't explanatorily indispensable. Given what he thinks about 'exists', I doubt that Kraut can regard this as a reasonable claim. But it seems quite reasonable to me. To see why, imagine we encounter some phenomenon such that: (i) it can be explained in terms of Fs or explained in terms of Gs; (ii) its explanation requires that we either invoke Fs or Gs; and (iii) its explanation doesn't require both Fs and Gs. Then I want to say that either Fs exist or Gs exist (maybe both), but whichever exists is not explanatorily indispensable. (This is an instance of the 'open question' arguments which Kraut deploys against his opponents, p.33.)


Hirsch's paper elaborates on the position he has been developing over several years (see his 2011).  He begins by outlining a three-part condition for when people should regard a debate as shallow. His condition is quite long so, rather than quoting it, let me illustrate it with an example. (My example is modelled on Hirsch's own motivating example, but it incorporates the need for the refinement he adds to his three-part condition; see pp. 106, 110-111.)  Suppose Ana and Ori speak a language with only one sentential connective, '|'. Ana treats this connective as NAND, Ori treats it as NOR, and they disagree for a while. Their disagreement is surely paradigmatically shallow, and the easiest way to see this is by observing that Ana and Ori can set up a simple translation between each other: when one says 'p|q', the other takes them to have said '[(p|p)|(q|q)]|[(p|p)|(q|q)]'. With this translation in place, their (superficial) disagreements will vanish.  Building on such examples, Hirsch's sufficient condition on shallowness is roughly this: a dispute is shallow if such a translation exists.

Before we assess this, let's consider its Carnapian-credentials. (1) Hirsch's scope is narrow, since different disputes will require different translations and sometimes no translation will be available; (2) formal languages play no special role; and (3) there is no real hint of empiricism in what I have outlined. (Interestingly, this last point may signify a slight shift for Hirsch. In previous work, he had contrasted the a priori with the empirical, leading Eklund (pp.176-7) to connect Hirsch with traditional empiricism. But in this paper, Hirsch explicitly moves away from discussing what is 'a priori necessary' (p.116).)

Now, Eklund offers an interesting challenge for any fan of Hirsch's approach. According to Eklund, there are three ways to understand the claim that some dispute is shallow:

(a) Actual [participants to the dispute] are merely speaking past each other.

(b) For quite general reasons . . . both actual and hypothetical [participants] will tend to speak past each other.

(c) For principled reasons [the participants must] always speak past each other (p.179).

Eklund notes that 'neither (a) nor (b) is strong enough to show that ontology per se' is at fault, and that (c) is implausibly strong (p.181). That's right, but I think that there is another option:

(d) The best way to make sense of reasonable participants to the dispute is to say that they speak different languages and so are not really disagreeing.

To see how my option (d) is distinct from Eklund's (c), let's continue with the earlier example. So, suppose that Ana and Ori are aware of the possibility of mutual intertranslation, but insist on trying to persist in their disagreement, by declaring 'we both want to speak the language with the metaphysically most natural sentential connective'. If we now interpret them in a way which leaves them unable to disagree with each other -- mapping one's 'p|q' and the other's '[(p|p)|(q|q)]|[(p|p)|(q|q)]' to the same sentence of our language -- then our interpretation will be somewhat infelicitous (cf. §1). So it might not be the best interpretation. Still, this is compatible with my (d); we need only say that Ana and Ori are here being unreasonable.

For his part, Hirsch does not speak of 'reasonableness', exactly. But he does talk about what participants to a debate ought to do, so that my option (d) is compatible with his approach. However, to develop option (d) further, we would need to say more about reasonableness, which may be tricky: I'm comfortable calling Ana and Ori 'unreasonable', here, but I'm unsure what to say about reasonableness in general. The upshot, then, is this. With Hirsch, we can invoke shallowness in the course of showing that there is something wrong with some (ontological) dispute per se. However, Eklund has drawn attention to the fact that we must do more than merely invoke shallowness.

I'll now consider a second very general issue concerning Hirsch's approach. If translations are to play a big role in metaontology, then we need to know what translations must preserve. Hirsch argues that translations only need to preserve truth-conditions, i.e. truth 'in possible worlds' (p.107). But this coarse-grained notion of translation simply squashes any hyperintensional matters, such as the questions of dependency raised by Koslicki in this volume (see §2), and Hawthorne 2009 has criticised Hirsch along these lines. Hirsch replies in this volume, and ultimately offers the following:

in different ontological languages there are different truths of the form "Such and such is a hyperintensional structure." . . . And I would agree that language-independent hyperintensional structures may strike many quantifier variantists as a cumbersome and dispensable complication (p.116).

I find this reply strikingly similar to the response I offered to Koslicki, on Carnap's behalf (see §2).

Nonetheless, even if coarse-grained translations are sufficient for dissolving metaphysical disputes, they should not be necessary. Consider the debate about whether all possible worlds contain at least one entity, or there is an empty possible world. I would hope to dissolve this debate. However, it raises questions about the very possible-world framework which Hirsch assumes in assessing the adequacy of translations. As such, it is unclear how Hirsch can deal with it (see Button 2013, pp.209-12).

In fact, Hirsch agrees that some disputes should be dissolved even though no translation is available. However, his reasons are rather different. Hirsch imagines nominalists who claim to be able grasp a proposition (still thought of as a 'division of logical space', p.118) which they admit that they can only express using platonist vocabulary. According to Hirsch, 'it's clear' that the semantic indispensability of the mathematical vocabulary is 'quite irrelevant' to the question of whether there is a substantial dispute between Platonism and nominalism (pp.118-19). I don't think it's clear.


The final neo-Carnapian position on offer is Thomasson's, whose paper provides a neat thumbnail of her easy ontology (see her 2015). I want to begin, though, by flagging a big difference between her and Hirsch. Hirsch famously advocates quantifier-variantism (see his 2011; he says very little about this in his paper in this volume). I understand quantifier-variantism as follows: the same quantifier can mean different things in different languages, and no particular meaning is 'metaphysically privileged'. To give this thesis more content, we must say what it means for the same quantifier to appear in different languages. But, waiving issues from §4 for now, perhaps we can individuate quantifiers by considering their 'rules of use' which can be shared across languages. (Note: the ensuing thesis is compatible with what Eklund calls 'weak quantifier-variance', pp.183-5.)

To motivate quantifier-variantism, consider the following. Mereological universalists regard 'there are not exactly two things' as necessarily true. Nihilists treat the same sentence (individuated orthographically) as contingent. With Putnam, I want to say that universalists and nihilists are both right by their own lights. As such, I must say that the very same sentence (individuated orthographically) means different things in their mouths. Now, that sentence can be symbolised in pure first-order logic as ∀x∀y(∀z(z = x ∨ z = y) → x = y). So, if I want to ascribe the difference in sentence-meaning to a difference in subsentential-meanings -- which is contestable -- then I should say that the same quantifiers (as individuated by their natural deduction rules) mean different things in their languages. And that's quantifier-variantism.

Thomasson rejects this line of thought (pp.134-7). She 'count[s] the meaning of a term as given by certain core rules of use' (p.135). Combining this with the suggestion that quantifiers should be individuated by their 'rules of use', Thomasson holds that the meaning of a quantifier cannot vary between languages. As such, Thomasson rejects quantifier-variantism, and holds that there is a genuine disagreement between nihilists and universalists. In particular, she thinks that the nihilists are wrong, and that the nihilists cannot even formulate a special (nihilistic) language in which they would be right.

In passing, Carnap surely would have disagreed with Thomasson here. Making ∀x∀y(∀z(z = x ∨ z = y) → x = y)  a fixed point would be to impart morals to logic, in the face of tolerance. But Thomasson is clear that her neo-Carnapian approach 'isn't so much a work of historical interpretation as appropriation' (p.124).quantifier-variance', pp.183-5.)

Evnine, however, criticises Thomasson's endorsement of mereological universalism more directly. He considers two principles concerning fusions (p.149):

(i) 'Whenever there are some things, there exists a fusion of those things'

(ii) 'Something is a fusion of some things iff it has all of them as parts and has no part that is distinct from each of them.'

If we take (i) as the definition of 'fusion', then we know that lots of fusions exist, but not whether fusions have parts. If we take (ii) as the definition, then we know that all fusions have parts, but not whether any exist. Evnine then claims that there is no good way for Thomasson to combine these two principles into a single definition. I would have thought, though, that Thomasson can just treat the conjunction of (i), (ii), and maybe some other principles, as analytic and as jointly providing us with the rules of use for words like 'fusion', 'part', etc. Evnine's anticipates this, and argues if we have 'no independent understanding' of the words 'part', 'whole', etc., before we say this, then these principles collectively tell us nothing (p.155). I fail to see the problem: if there are enough principles, then they will tell us everything we want them to. This is consonant with Thomasson's own reply to Evnine, which notes that 'Terms may be interdefined and introduced in large clusters with rules governing their interrelations' (2015, p.226).

I now want to set aside issues about mereology, though, and turn to the main point of Thomasson's paper, which comes through in the following argument:

In raising an existence question, we must use a term ('number', 'property', 'proposition' . . . ) to ask 'are there numbers/properties/propositions?' But if we are using those terms according to the rules of use by which they come to be introduced to the language, then those rules enable us to resolve the questions straightforwardly (through analytic or empirical means) . . . So, if the question is not supposed to be so straightforwardly answerable . . . then it must be aiming to use the terms in question without their being governed by the standard rules of use. But if [traditional metaphysicians] attempt to use the terms while severing them from these rules of use, they make the terms meaningless, and the questions pseudo-questions. (p.127)

This argument leads straight to her easy ontology, since questions are either 'straightforward' or 'meaningless'.

Assessing its Carnapian credentials: (1) the scope is quite broad, since Thomasson applies this dichotomy to all existence questions, and (2) there is no suggestion that the rules need to be given in a formal language. However, (3) as Eklund remarks, there is much about Thomasson that is reminiscent of 'a rather traditional empiricist' (p.177). In particular, Thomasson's argument requires 'that all questions are either analytic or empirical' (p.177). In common with traditional empiricism, then, Thomasson excludes the possibility 'that some questions are substantive a priori, or that as Quine argued, the distinctions here should be discarded' (p.178). For her part, Thomasson is quite happy to be linked to traditional empiricism in this way (although she explicitly disavows verificationism, p.127), and she sketches her particular reasons for disagreeing with Quine (pp.128-3). Eklund, in turn, draws on Boghossian to criticize Thomasson's invocation of analyticity (pp.171-8). I shall not attempt to adjudicate their dispute, but both contributions are well worth reading.

I should, though, voice a further concern about easy ontology. In the argument just quoted. Thomasson holds that 'standard rules of use' allow for straightforward answers to existence-questions. But I doubt this (see my 2016). Our ordinary words are governed by indeterminate and conflicting patterns of usage, which may point us in opposite directions simultaneously.

Biggs and Wilson

This concern -- about the messiness of our language -- dovetails nicely with Biggs and Wilson's excellent paper. For they also aim to turn considerations about linguistic indeterminacy into a (partial) defence of traditional metaphysics. They first argue that the indeterminacy of natural kind terms raises problems for Chalmers -- Jackson-style two-dimensional semantics. Their argument here is truly lovely; it turns on the fact that we cannot 'foresee' all possible indeterminacies in our kind terms, since the various ways in which a kind term's extension might be indeterminate only become visible due to unpredictable 'accidents' (p.88).

Biggs and Wilson note that Carnap himself was aware of issues concerning indeterminacy; this, indeed, is why Carnap introduced explication (cf. point (2) of §3). However, as Biggs and Wilson note, Carnap's notion of explication involves appealing to the same theoretical virtues as the contemporary notion of inference to the best explanation (pp.85, 90). They then turn on Carnap, arguing that we should employ inference to the best explanation rather than explication when called upon to resolve questions about a word's intension. (They also criticise Carnap's own attempts to suggest that explication is necessary here, pp.98-100.) But, having admitted inference to the best explanation in philosophy of language, there will be no way to prevent metaphysicians from using it to their own ends (p.97). The upshot, then, is an exciting challenge for (neo-)Carnapians: show us how to avoid inference to the best explanation in the philosophy of language.


I wrote this during a period of research leave which was funded by a Philip Leverhulme Prize (awarded by the Leverhulme Trust, PLP-2014-140). Many thanks to the Stephen Biggs, Matti Eklund, Thomas Hofweber, Amie Thomasson and Jessica Wilson for discussing a draft of this review with me, and helping to correct my many misunderstandings.


Button, Tim. 2013. The Limits of Realism. OUP.

Button, Tim. 2016. Deflationary metaphysics and ordinary language. Synthese. doi 10.1007/s11229-016-1212-z.

Carnap, Rudolf. 1950. 'Empiricism, Semantics and Ontology'. Revue Internationale de Philosophie 4 pp.20-40.

Hawthorne, John. Superficialism in Ontology. In Chalmers, Manley and Wasserman (eds.), Metametaphysics: New essays on the foundations of ontology. OUP, pp.213-30.

Hellman, Geoffrey. 1989. Mathematics without Numbers: Towards a modal-structural interpretation. OUP.

Hirsch, Eli. 2011. Quantifier Variance and Realism: Essays in metaontology. OUP.

Hofweber, Thomas. 2016. Ontology and the Ambitions of Metaphysics. OUP.

Thomasson, Amie. 2015. Ontology made Easy. OUP