Ontology and Explanation: Collected Papers

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Laird Addis, Mind: Ontology and Explanation: Collected Papers, 1981-2005, Ontos, 2008, 290pp., $122.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783938793862.

Reviewed by Katalin Farkas, Central European University, Budapest


Consciousness and intentionality are widely held to be the two main aspects of the mental that call for a philosophical account. In recent decades, there has been a growing interest in studying the relationship between these two aspects, with some philosophers claiming that consciousness is to be explained in terms of intentionality, with others attempting to explain intentionality in phenomenal terms. This collection of essays by Laird Addis contains the elements of a well thought out and original proposal on this very subject. The thesis is that "Consciousness is just intentionality: to be in a conscious state is to be in an intentional state" (p. 1). Though the thesis is not argued for directly, it follows from the various subsidiary theses defended in the essays which were published between 1981 and 2005. In Addis's view, intentionality is an intrinsic feature of all and only conscious mental states, including feelings of sensations and of emotions, while non-conscious states like standing beliefs are best understood as dispositional states which are not themselves intentional, though they have essential connections to their conscious realisations.

Following Addis's thoughts on the subject is actually a rather refreshing experience for someone arriving from the contemporary discussion, since almost none of the characters familiar from these discussions are mentioned in Addis's essays. Obviously, this is partly explained by the fact that a number of the essays were written before the recent wave of interest in the topic of consciousness and intentionality, but I suspect that that's not the only explanation, especially considering that the last essay was written in 2002 and published in 2005. Addis relies on a somewhat narrowly circumscribed philosophical tradition, in which the figure of Gustav Bergmann looms large. Other influences -- in the form of both agreement and disagreement -- include Meinong, Brentano, Husserl, Sartre, Russell and Searle.

Reading the discussion that sidesteps the work of the usual suspects is, as I said, positively refreshing. The experience also serves as a reminder that if one enjoys a uniform diet of authors who refer to each other and move in the same space of options, one can easily forget how much we take for granted in a certain discourse. But while I appreciated the change of scene, I also thought that some of Addis's arguments would have benefited from taking a wider perspective, as I'll explain below.

Let me first discuss the claims that support the thesis that consciousness is intentionality. Addis classifies mental phenomena into three categories. The first encompasses all mental states that make up the stream of consciousness. Addis expresses agreement "with Husserl and Sartre that consciousness is always consciousness of something" (p. 99). A conscious state consists of a subject who exemplifies two monadic properties: one is a mode property, which determines what kind of awareness is involved in the state (imagining, judging, feeling or sensing, etc.) the other is an intentional property, which determines what the state is about (pp. 9, 94, more on this below). For example, if one imagines that Mars exploded, this is a state that involves one's exemplifying a property of imagining, and the property being-of-the-explosion-of-Mars which intrinsically represents a certain event, its intentional object. The object itself is not a constituent of the state: if the event takes place, then there is an intentional connection between the event and the intentional property; if the event doesn’t take place, there is no intentional connection.

The thesis that all conscious states are intentional is traditionally supposed to be problematic for sensations like pain, and certain emotions like unfocused anger: being in pain or being angry, it is said, is not about anything -- it's just a certain way of feeling. But Addis thinks that these states (the second category of mental states) also have a phenomenally detectable act/object structure, with the objects being what he calls 'secondary mental entities', which include emotions and sensations, and, should there be such things, sense-data, images and afterimages (see "Pains and Other Secondary Mental Entities" (1986) and "The Ontology of Emotions" (1995)).

Being angry, for example, involves a subject exemplifying the intentional property being-of-anger and a mode property being-a-feeling. The object of the state is anger, a secondary mental entity; it cannot be identified with any physical entity. With some qualifications, Addis endorses the claim that secondary mental entities exist only when they are intentional objects: pains or emotions exist if and only if they are felt (p. 94, fn. 6). This contrasts with objects like the planet Mars, which exists whether or not it is an intentional object of a conscious state, and with intentional objects like unicorns or mermaids, which simply don't exist. The dependence of secondary mental entities on conscious states, however, is not ontological: since intentional objects are not constituents of intentional states, the pain one feels is not a constituent of the conscious state of feeling a pain (p. 51). Thus one cannot exclude the ontological possibility of a sensation existing unfelt, or a conscious state directed at a non-existent sensation (pp. 58-59). Still, there is a suggestion of at least a causal dependence (pp. 8, 100).

It is instructive to compare this account of the intentionality of sensations with some other attempts to show that sensations, like pains, are intentional or representational (I use these terms here as synonyms). On these alternative accounts (see e.g. Tye 1995 or Crane 2003) the intentional object is not a sensation that probably exists only as long as it's felt, but some bodily part, for example, the foot where one feels a pain. Addis's theory is probably not attractive to those who attempt to give a representational account of sensations in the hope of supporting a naturalistic or reductive explanation of the mind. However, those who are moved by some other -- say, phenomenological -- argument in favour of the intentionality of conscious states, may very well find Addis's alternative proposal about the relation between sensations or emotions and objects worth considering. Addis is adamant that anger itself is not intentional, it's not about anything. If we have an apparent aboutness of anger, for example I am angry with my neighbour, then the explanation is that in addition to the state whose object is the emotion, I have another intentional mental state, whose object is my neighbour, and this latter state causes the former. In other words, some thought of my neighbour causes another state, which is directed at anger.

Addis puts great emphasis on the act/object structure of sensations and emotions, but I must admit that the obviousness of this allegedly phenomenally salient structure has always eluded me no matter how hard I tried to investigate my own sensations. It is certainly true that I can focus on a pain in my foot, and perhaps try to analyse its features, to see whether it's more or less intense, whether it's dull or blunt, and so on. But this exercise is a reflective act, involving a higher-order state whose object is my pain-experience as a whole; the existence of this reflective intentional state -- which does have an object, the experience -- does not show that the original experience itself involved an act/object structure. And while it's true that feeling a pain involves awareness of some sort, this is simply the same as saying that it is a conscious state, which would be accepted by all parties. To go further and say that therefore it must be a consciousness of something, simply begs the question in favour of the act/object theory (see also Crane 2003).

The third class of mental states, called 'tertiary mental entities', includes standing non-conscious states like beliefs, hopes, desires, and so on. Having these states amounts to a disposition to have certain conscious mental states, and tertiary mental states are mental only in virtue of their connection to primary mental entities. So non-conscious beliefs are in fact non-intentional themselves, but their existence is not in conflict with the theory that "consciousness is intentionality". If states like beliefs and desires are apparently intentional, since they seem to be about things, this can be explained through their connections to genuinely intentional conscious states. The connections Addis discusses are quite intricate and include a detailed account of dispositions themselves, which has various consequences for the issue of explaining actions in terms of dispositional mental states (see e.g. "Dispositions, Explanation, and Behaviour" (1981)). The rich details of the picture cannot be reconstructed here, but contemporary defenders of the notion of 'phenomenal intentionality' -- the view that intentionality is grounded in the phenomenal character of conscious states -- will be interested in finding out more about this picture, since they share the concern of how to account for the apparent intentionality of non-conscious states.

One of the central theses of Addis's work is the claim that a conscious mental state has intentional features in virtue of exemplifying a monadic property, which "by its very nature" (p. 32) is about, or of, certain things. Such properties he calls 'natural signs', following a terminology apparently due to William of Ockham. 'Natural' in this case has nothing to do with Grice's 'natural meaning'; the properties in question belong to a distinct realm of mental properties which cannot be reduced to physical or functional properties of the brain or the body. Addis holds a kind of psycho-physiological parallelism, and it is his repeatedly expressed conviction (e.g. pp. 3, 77, 89) that a dualism of properties, and hence a denial of what he calls 'absolute materialism' -- the view that everything is physical -- is perfectly compatible with the scientific worldview, which he thoroughly respects. Addis is also the author of a book titled Natural Signs (1989), which contains a more detailed account of his theory of intentionality. A paper with the same title from 1983, one of the essays in the present collection, contains his three main arguments for the view. The arguments are summarised in a number of the essays, and remain basically unchanged throughout. The 2005 paper "The Necessity and Nature of Mental Content" connects this view to the terminology of the externalism/internalism debate about mental content. Addis takes his own view to be a version of a narrow content theory, the theory that intentional features of conscious mental states are determined by some of their intrinsic properties. Given the apparent renewed interest in internalism these days, it's instructive to see what sort of motivations lie behind a committed and thorough-going internalist theory.

The first argument is called the 'scientific argument' (pp. 29-31, 69, 132-3), and it is based on the claim that certain differences in linguistic and other behaviour between two subjects -- for example giving different answers to the question 'what are you thinking about?' -- who are in the same external circumstances must be explained by some prior difference in their monadic properties ("the principle of different effects, different causes" (p. 132)). As Addis remarks, this is not, in itself, an argument for the claim that the properties in question must be natural signs; but it is an argument for the claim that some sort of intrinsic property of conscious states correlates with what a person is thinking about.

This argument has, no doubt, a great deal of plausibility; but one would be interested to know how Addis would respond to some of the related discussion that has taken places over the last thirty years. Consider, for example, that Jerry Fodor (none of whose work is mentioned in the bibliography) put forward influential arguments for narrow psychological features, based on the claims that these features have a causal explanatory role in producing behaviour, and that causation is local (1980, 1987). Fodor's own development of the idea was based on a distinction between narrow content -- the local explanatory cause of behaviour -- and broad content, which was responsible for full-blown semantic features. So it seems that something like Addis's scientific argument goes only part of the way to establish the narrowness of all intentionality.

Another interesting reaction to these arguments came from defenders of the explanatory role of broad contents: several authors argued (starting with Peacocke, 1981) that if we individuate behaviour broadly -- as we seem to have good reason to do in a number of cases -- then broad mental states are actually better in explaining behaviour. I wonder how Addis would respond to this challenge.

The second argument is named the 'phenomenological argument' (pp. 32-8, 134). We can identify the contents of our thoughts directly and with great certainty; the best explanation for this, Addis claims, is an immediate acquaintance with natural signs. I do agree that an ability to account for features of self-knowledge is one of the main recommendations of a theory of intrinsic intentionality; however, this claim has also been debated by the opposing camp. John Heil (1986) -- and then many others -- argued that knowledge of our thoughts is to be explained by the contextually self-verifying character of certain higher order thoughts in a way that is perfectly compatible with denying the narrowness of content. It's not clear that these theories do indeed account for the entire phenomenon of self-knowledge; but. in any case, it would be interesting to see how the phenomenological argument can be defended from this objection.

The third, 'dialectical argument' points out that not all representation can be conventional: if there is to be conventional representation, "there must be natural representation, a kind of representation that involves entities that by their intrinsic nature represent whatever they do represent" (135). The argument is worked out in convincing detail, as far as certain alternatives are concerned (38-47). However, in this case too, as with the previous arguments, little consideration appears to be given to one robust alternative, namely the view that representation is grounded in relations to the environment. The essay "Intrinsic Reference and the New Theory", as well as parts of "The Necessity and Nature of Mental Content" (2005) do discuss the externalist challenge, but the criticism is aimed against specific versions which are hardly representative of the full range of externalist options.


Crane, Tim 2003, "The Intentional Structure of Consciousness" in Consciousness: New Philosophical Perspectives, edited by A. Jokic and Q. Smith. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press: 33-56.

Fodor, Jerry 1980, "Methodological Solipsism Considered as a Research Strategy in Cognitive Science," Behavioral and Brain Sciences 3: 63-73.

Fodor, Jerry A. 1987, Psychosemantics. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press

Heil, John 1988, "Privileged Access," Mind 47: 238-251.

Peacocke, Christopher 1981, "Demonstrative Belief and Psychological Explanation," Synthese 49: 187-21.

Tye, Michael 1995, Ten problems of consciousness. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.