Ontology and Metaontology: A Contemporary Guide

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Francesco Berto and Matteo Plebani, Ontology and Metaontology: A Contemporary Guide, Bloomsbury, 2015, 200pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441182890.

Reviewed by Bradley Rettler, Baylor University


Francesco Berto and Matteo Plebani's book is a guide to the topics in its title. The book is composed of three parts: Quinean Metaontology, Alternative Metaontologies, and Ontology. The first two take up roughly the first half of the book (pp. 1-119), and the last part takes up the remaining half (pp. 121-228).

Quinean metaontology is divided into three chapters: 1) On Denoting, 2) 1948: On What There Is, and 3) The Standard View. Alternative Metaontologies is divided into five chapters: 4) Ontological Pluralism and Neo-Fregeanism, 5) Carnap's View of Ontology and Neo-Carnapians, 6) Fictionalism, 7) Meinongianism, and 8) The Grounding Approach. Ontology is divided into six chapters: 9) Abstract Objects I: Numbers and Co., 10) Abstract Objects II: Linguistic Types, Propositions and Values, 11) Possible Worlds, 12) Material Objects, 13) Fictional Objects, and 14) Beyond Particulars: Properties and Events.

Each chapter contains an outline (which is basically a table of contents for the chapter), an introductory paragraph, and suggestions for further reading at the end. As each view is discussed, those who hold the view are referenced. At the end are references, an author index, and a subject index. It would have been nice to have had a glossary and for new terms of art to be emphasized in some way.

Bloomsbury describes the book as:

a clear and accessible survey of ontology, focussing on the most recent trends in the discipline . . . The guide's modular structure allows for a flexible approach to the subject, making it suitable for both undergraduates and postgraduates looking to better understand and apply the exciting developments and debates taking place in ontology today.

In my opinion, this description is accurate. I will be reviewing the book on the assumption that those interested in the review are either teaching a course on the topics or are not already working on the topics but wish to get acquainted with them. I do not think anyone doing work in ontology or metaontology will find new things in this book, though they may appreciate the way the views are presented. I'll give an outline with some critical comments interspersed, and conclude with general thoughts on for whom this book is good and why.

Parts and I and II: Metaontology

One of the book's more interesting features is that it starts with "On Denoting". Most introductions to metaontology start with Quine's "On What There Is". Berto and Plebani's choice is a good one. They introduce the notions of singular terms and definite descriptions, the introduction of which paves the way for the introduction of quantifiers. And discussion of the present king of France and paraphrasing of sentences seemingly about him paves the way for discussing Quine's criteria of ontological commitment and paraphrase of quantification over abstracta and other untoward entities. There's also a discussion of hermeneutic vs. revolutionary paraphrases.

Chapter 4 covers Kris McDaniel's "Ways of Being" and Jason Turner's "Ontological Pluralism" and points out that ontological pluralists can allow for a generic quantifier but must insist that it is less natural (or less fundamental) than the multiple quantifiers. It concludes with McDaniel vs. Peter van Inwagen on the relation between quantification and "the number of". The section on neo-Fregeanism is primarily devoted to abstraction principles, in particular Hume's Principle: the number of Fs = the number of Gs iff the Fs and Gs are 1-1 related. This principle, combined with the claim that sometimes objects are 1-1 related, entails that there are numbers. The strategy generalizes and purports to prove the existence of a wide variety of kinds of things. The section concludes with the Julius Caesar objection: the implicit definition (in this case, of the concept of number) doesn't tell us why Julius Caesar is not a number. There are two other objections offered to neo-Fregeanism. The three objections take up just one page; they go by a bit more quickly than one would wish.

The chapter on Carnap begins with the idea of frameworks, though they remain neutral between the earlier "framework of entities" and the later "linguistic framework". This sets the stage for the distinction between internal and external questions, though the crucial paragraph is confusing. The former are "factual questions asked in an internal vein", while the latter are "practical questions about the adoption of a certain kind of language". Attention then turns to Eli Hirsch's quantifier variance, the view that ontological disputes are merely verbal because people are speaking different languages (specifically, languages with different quantifiers). The section concludes with Thomas Hofweber's view -- that the quantifier has an external role (what's in the world) and an internal/inferential role. I've never understood what Hofweber means by the latter, and while this book does a good job of representing Hofweber, it doesn't make the view any clearer.

Chapter 6, on fictionalism, provides a variety of views whereby ontological discourse is taken to be like talk of Sherlock Holmes. This is one of the best sections, laying out various accounts of fictional discourse, then showing how philosophers apply them to ontology, and then offering and discussing the problems with fictionalist approaches.

Chapter 7: Meinongianism is the best one in the book, in my opinion. Meinongianism is often used as a foil, but rarely is it taken seriously and explored as a live option. This book is a welcome change. Berto and Matteo Plebani begin by discussing the relationship between Meinongianism and quantification, suggesting that Meinongians think that existence is captured by an existence predicate, not a quantifier -- the quantifier captures being. So, there are fictional characters and numbers and mere possibilia, but they don't exist. $x(x is a unicorn), but unicorns don't exist. The rest of the chapter explores what Meinongians can say to make that an attractive view. Meinongians have to explain what non-existent objects there are, as well as what kind of properties they have and how they have them, and the chapter surveys their options.

Metaontology concludes with the grounding approach. After introducing the notion via examples and some of its formal features, the authors attempt to put it in conversation with the other metaontological approaches and then draw out some problems. These discussions are quite cursory, only two and a half pages,long. An introduction to grounding is certainly better found elsewhere.

Part III: Ontology

In Part III, attention is turned to ontology. A notable omission here is the existence of past and future objects and slightly less noticeable omissions are the ontology of art and social ontology. The first two sections are taken up with abstract objects -- first numbers, then propositions. After a brief foray into an attempt at stating the vexed distinction between abstract and concrete objects, Berto and Plebani turn to reasons not to posit numbers: nobody's touched them, and we have no idea what their identity conditions might be. Then they present reasons to accept them -- claims about them seem obviously true and to entail that they exist. This is followed by a discussion of various ways to be a nominalist, which is mostly focused on Hartry Field, and ways to be a platonist, which is lighter on the Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument than I would have expected and heavy on neo-Fregeanism. The authors conclude the chapter on numbers with a nice discussion of ontology vs ideology, where the classics (Quine, Boolos) are chosen over the current discussion (Cian Dorr, Ted Sider).

Next is propositions. After a cursory explanation of sentence-types, Berto and Plebani list a reason to accept propositions (that they help make sense of valid inferences) and a few reasons to doubt them (it's difficult to give their identity conditions, for one). Then comes the longest application of metaontology to the ontology section. The authors apply Hofweber's neo-Carnapian two-quantifier view to the debate about propositions. Then there's a brief foray into ethics -- whether error theory can be of use to nominalists and whether we have to follow the rules if there are no such things as rules because there are no abstract objects.

The next chapter is dedicated to possible worlds. The introduction comes in terms of de dicto and de re modality, and Quantified Modal Logic is not mentioned. Lewis' genuine modal realism is explained, and the authors opt to discuss an epistemological objection and the Humphrey objection, foregoing van Inwagen's tu quoque and the seventeen worlds objection (how can genuine modal realism guarantee there's a world for every way things could be and not seventeen worlds?). Ersatzism and combinatorialism comprise the rest of the section on modal realism. The nonstandard approaches are fictionalism and Meinongianism.

In the material objects chapter, Berto and Plebani introduce the intuitive notions of material object and parthood and briefly explain some of the formal features of the parthood relation. Then they delve into decomposition (are there atoms?) and composition (are there mereological sums, and if so, does every class have a sum?). Mereological nihilism and mereological universalism are discussed, but only one argument for or against either (it's an argument for universalism, and it's not the argument from vagueness) is given. Then co-location is introduced via a very truncated Tibbles puzzle, and two families of solutions are discussed -- sortal theories and one object, one place theories. The chapter ends with the Problem of Temporary Intrinsics and the endurantist, perdurantist, and exdurantist solutions.

The next chapter discusses fictional objects and the theories of what fictional characters are. The first view is realist abstractionism, whereby fictional characters are abstract created things. This view also has to account for how fictional characters have two different kinds of properties -- one kind in the fiction (like having brown hair) and one kind outside the fiction (like being the main character of a novel by JK Rowling). The view appeals to two kinds of instantiation. Then there's fictionalism about fictional characters, and Meinongianism about fictional characters.

The ontology section concludes with properties and events. The properties section includes platonism, along with the instantiation regress objection and the Russellian objection, and nominalisms -- ostrich, predicate, and resemblance -- and trope theory. The section on events gets only two pages.

Thus concludes my summary. I trust it gives enough information about what is covered for the reader to get a good idea as to whether this is what she's looking for. Now, a few thoughts about how the contents are covered.

Evaluation and Conclusion

Overall the book is very good, and it covers a huge range of topics in a small amount of space. Nearly all of the views that I would expect to find are included, and the writing is (aside from a noticeable number of typos) clear.

The book is long on views and short on arguments. Usually the method is to introduce a subject and then give a variety of views on the subject and objections to those views. There are very few arguments for any view. Given that the target is people who aren't too familiar with the issues, it's unfortunate that much of the discussion is not detailed enough to be helpful to someone who has not already read the relevant literature. There are many nods to views without explicit statements of them, and some objections are made in passing in a way that makes them difficult to understand. For each view presented the book does a good job of pointing the reader to a paper or book with a more detailed explication.

Part III is quite disconnected from Part I and Part II; most of the metaontology views are rarely referred to during the ontology section. Berto and Plebani often say that they're presupposing the Quinean view, but they do not say how things would be different if a different approach were used. And things would often be very different if, say, the grounding account were used.

As someone working in both ontology and metaontology, I think there are notable absences from the reference section. There is no discussion or mention of the work of Elizabeth Barnes, Karen Bennett, Berit Brogaard, Shamik Dasgupta, Carrie Jenkins, Daniel Korman, Kathrin Koslicki, Trenton Merricks, Eric Olson, Laurie Paul, or Michael Rea, among others. Obviously a text can't cover everything, but I've assigned or been assigned each of these people in classes on this topic. Perhaps the suggestions for further reading should have been expanded so as to incorporate them. Of the authors that are included, the emphasis is pretty much what one would expect; the philosopher with the most works cited is Quine at 14, then van Inwagen and Stephen Yablo at 10 and Lewis with 8.

I highly recommend this book to first and second year graduate students interested in working in metaontology and ontology as a starting point for figuring the particular topics in which they're interested. I will recommend it to friends working outside of metaphysics who are interested in knowing what's going on in metaphysics. And I will add this book to the "Further Resources" section of my syllabus for courses on these topics. I don't think the arguments are presented in enough detail to make it the focus of discussion, so I'll suggest it to students who want a sense of what's going on in the discipline overall. It is a helpful introduction and guide to the topics it covers, which is exactly what it's intended to be.