Ontology and Oppression: Race, Gender, and Social Reality

Ontology And Oppression

Katharine Jenkins, Ontology and Oppression: Race, Gender, and Social Reality, Oxford University Press, 2023, 268pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780197666784.

Reviewed by Charlotte Witt, University of New Hampshire


Katharine Jenkins has artfully stitched together a radically pluralist account of human social kinds using materials drawn from recent work in analytic feminist metaphysics. If the reader is interested in an overview of recent developments in social ontology, Jenkins’ book would be a good place to start. In addition, Jenkins identifies and defines two novel kinds of ontological wrongs, namely ontic injustice and ontic oppression, a species of ontic injustice. Jenkins argues that an individual can be the victim of ontic injustice simply in virtue of being a member of a social kind when the constraints and enablements which constitute (or partially constitute) the kind are wrongful to the individual (3, 46). Borrowing an idea from Jean Hampton (1991), Jenkins argues that kind membership can deliver moral harm even if the individual is not actually subjected to, or harmed by, the constraints and enablements that constitute the kind to which they belong. An individual is subject to ontic oppression if these constraints and enablements regularly channel individuals in the kind towards one (or more) of the several faces of oppression developed by Iris Marion Young (2011) and slightly emended by Jenkins.

This review will focus on three aspects of Jenkins’ book without hoping to do justice to its complex argument, and its rich discussion of conceptual resources and alternative views. First, I focus on Jenkins’ radically pluralistic social ontology, and I raise questions about the ontological disunity that threatens her account of social kinds including gender and race kinds. Then I discuss Jenkins’ use of the constraints and enablements framework (CEF) to structure her social ontology and I consider its resources for emancipatory projects. Finally, I briefly address Jenkins’ critique of the “Ontology-First” view that shapes public discourse about gender as exemplified in the recent debate in the UK over reform of the Gender Recognition Act. I raise some questions about each of these topics in the hopes of clarifying Jenkins’ ideas. I focus on gender kinds in this review for reasons of space.

Let’s begin with Jenkins’ radical ontological pluralism concerning gender (and race). I call it “radical” pluralism because Jenkins’ taxonomy of genders includes many genders as well as several kinds of gender kinds. For Jenkins, ontology is a pragmatic, explanatory project that begins with a goal or purpose (in her case an emancipatory project) and asks what ontology of social kinds would be most useful in contributing to that end. “There is no single streamlined set of kinds that can do all the explanatory work we need to do” (84). It turns out that with regard to both gender kinds and racialized kinds, the most useful kinds are not only those on the familiar lists of genders and races, but also several kinds of those kinds. Jenkins distinguishes three kinds of gender and race kinds: hegemonic, interpersonal, and identification kinds. For example, women can be viewed as part of an oppressive gender system (hegemonic kind of gender kinds) or as they engage interpersonal relationships (interpersonal kind of gender kinds) or as they identify as women (identity kind of gender kinds). As an additional epicycle Jenkins differentiates between two kinds of identity kinds, norm relevance kinds (individuals who find gender norms relevant to them) and identification kinds (individuals who choose to identify with gender norms). Further, she argues that hegemonic gender kinds should include modes like trans and cis as well as a gender kind she labels “anomalous” for individuals who do not fit in the hegemonic binary genders. Jenkins’ complex taxonomy of genders has certain explanatory advantages. For example, it allows her to argue in a nuanced fashion that some gender kinds are ontologically unjust or oppressive, but others are not. For example, Jenkins argues that subordinate hegemonic gender kinds are oppressive, but some interpersonal or some identity gender kinds are not. Jenkin’s radical ontological pluralism provides rich and varied resources for diverse explanatory projects ranging from fine-grained, intersectional inquiries to systematic investigations of social structures and practices. However, we might wonder what unifies Jenkins radical plurality of gender kinds. What makes them all gender kinds?

According to Jenkins each human social kind is unified by the property of falling under the constraints and enablements that constitute (or partially constitute) them (84). We might ask: What makes hegemonic, interpersonal, and identity kinds all gender kinds—given that the constraints and enablements that constitute them are different? Or, as Jenkins puts it, “the unification question is: What makes it the case that the kind belongs to a certain category of social kind, for example the category ‘gender kind’” (186). Jenkins tentatively suggests (but does not fully endorse) unifying grounds for hegemonic, interpersonal, and identity gender kinds. Developing an idea from Elizabeth Barnes (2020), Jenkins proposes that they are all gender kinds because of their historical relation to gendered and hierarchical social structures; the very structures that underlie hegemonic gender kinds. But this proposal raises many questions. Doesn’t this prioritize and center hierarchical gender kinds? Aren’t there many different gendered, hierarchical social structures? If the relationship is historical (which Jenkins seems to favor) should we think of gender kinds as lineages in the biological sense of the term? Without a satisfactory explanation of how the kinds of gender kinds are unified, Jenkins’ radical ontological pluralism concerning genders does not hang together. Moreover, according to Jenkins, human social kinds are explanatory in so far as they are unified by bundles of social constraints and enablements: “The CEF [constraints and enablements framework] holds that a given human social kind is an explanatory kind that is unified by a particular bundle of social constraints and enablements” (115). Since the explanatory work of human social kinds goes hand in hand with the unity of the kinds by means of constraints and enablements, the problem of unity presents a difficulty not just theoretically and in principle, but practically and in relation to Jenkins’ own explanatory projects in pursuit of emancipation.

But how exactly does a social ontology, an account of what is, become harnessed to emancipatory goals, a vision of what should be? The most important component in Jenkins’ attempt to bridge the gap between her ontology and her emancipatory goals might appear to be the constraints and enablements framework (CEF): “I term it ‘the constraints and enablements framework’ because it treats human social kinds as at least partly constituted by constraints and enablements” (76). The basic idea is that an individual who is a member of a social kind thereby becomes subject to a range of constraints or enablements on their social agency. To use Jenkins’ example, an individual who is a wife thereby has a range of things they can (enablements) and cannot (constraints) do. To be a member of a human social kind is to be constrained and enabled in various ways. The notion of a constraint seems restrictive and unfree, while the idea of enablement sounds powerful and agentic. It is important to note, however, that the CEF is a factual and descriptive framework, and not a normative or political one. Constraints (as such) are not oppressive and harmful, and enablements (as such) are not liberatory or beneficial. How then does the CEF connect to normative issues? As I understand it, normative considerations enter the picture in two ways; in relation to the goals of the inquiry, namely its emancipatory goals, and with the notion of ontic injustice, the idea that membership in a social kind (just in itself) can be harmful and inflict moral injury (depending upon the constraints and enablements that constitute the kind).

To see in more detail how the existence of ontic injustice can shape specific political arguments and strategic evaluations, let’s consider Jenkins’ critique of prioritizing ontology in the explanations of social phenomena. In debating normative issues or strategic options, should we settle ontological questions first? Like Robin Dembroff (2018), Jenkins thinks that “When it comes to social reality we should not ‘choose reality’ simply because it is reality; we should first ask what that reality is like, specifically whether it is just or unjust” (5). The possibility of ontic injustice and ontic oppression knit together Jenkins’ pluralist social ontology, her constraints and enablements framework, and her emancipatory projects. And, according to Jenkins, the possibility of ontic injustice “entails the rejection of the Ontology-First approach” (201).

For example, consider the recent debate in the UK over reform of the Gender Recognition Act. Jenkins argues that the terms of debate (on both sides) often presuppose an Ontology-First position, which is the view that we ought to settle the correct ontology of social kinds like gender first and then shape our social practices and regulations based on our ontology. Jenkins argues that this argument strategy is both mistaken and harmful to trans liberation. Two features of Jenkins’ social ontology cut against the Ontology-First direction of argument. First, Jenkins argues that the existence of ontic injustice (and ontic oppression) in itself, is enough to motivate a rejection of the view. “Overall, then, recognizing the possibility of ontic oppression shows that the Ontology—First approach is unjustified” (218). Next, Jenkins also thinks her gender pluralism sinks the Ontology-First approach because there is no one thing that gender is that could be determined first. What genders exist depends on what it is that you want to explain:

On this account various, different varieties of gender kinds have explanatory value for different tasks within an emancipatory project. These kinds include hegemonic gender kinds, which are (roughly) sex-based hierarchical social roles, interpersonal gender kinds, which are based on the ways in which people respond to each other in specific social contexts; and gender identity kinds, which are based on a person’s sense of self. Our ontological picture, I argued, should include each of these types of gender kinds. (222)

Because of Jenkins’ radical ontological pluralism, there simply is no one gender kind from which our explanations of social and political phenomena could flow. In fact,for Jenkins, the direction of explanation is precisely the opposite: from our liberatory goals and emancipatory practices to the gender ontologies we need to articulate and to explain them.

It seems to this reader that Jenkins’ rejection of Ontology-First argument strategies in the current debates over gender recognition (and elsewhere), and the reasons that she gives for rejecting this line of argument (her pluralist ontology of social kinds, plus ontic injustice), clearly rely on, and follow from, her own ontological views as developed in this book. So, in at least a general sense, the primacy of getting the social ontology right in relation to emancipatory projects persists in her work. Jenkins’ book provides a robust framework (CEF) for an ontology of human social kinds that can be used to argue for specific liberating social practices, and to do so using arguments that reflect her radically pluralist social ontology. I recommend Ontology and Oppression to anyone interested in recent developments in analytic social ontology. Jenkins makes a powerful argument in favor of a radical pluralist ontology of human social kinds, traces out its application to gender and race kinds, and makes a case for its emancipatory potential.


Barnes, Elizabeth. 2020. “Gender and Gender Terms” Nous 54 (3): 704–30.

Dembroff, Robin. 2018. “Real Talk on the Metaphysics of Gender.” Philosophical Topics 46 (2): 21–50.

Hampton, Jean. 1991. “Correcting Harms versus Righting Wrongs: The Goal of Retribution.” UCLA Law Review 39: 1659–1702.

Young, Iris Marion. 2011, Justice and the Politics of Difference. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.