Ontology and Providence in Creation: Taking Ex Nihilo Seriously

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Mark Ian Thomas Robson, Ontology and Providence in Creation: Taking Ex Nihilo Seriously, Continuum, 2008, 223pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847062154.

Reviewed by Timothy Pawl, University of Saint Thomas (Minnesota)



Robson’s book is an addition to the literature on the ontology of possibility, creation and providence. Robson defends a strong view of creation ex nihilo. According to him, creation ex nihilo isn’t merely creation without the use of pre-existing materials; creation ex nihilo is creation that doesn’t make use of prior knowledge of how things could be, such as knowledge of any possible creatures or possible types of creatures. Prior to creation, for example, God didn’t have knowledge concerning what humans in general or even Adam in particular would be like, for the simple reason that there was no knowledge of this sort to be had. Possibility was, in Robson’s terminology, indeterminate. As Robson writes:

if I asked God, before the creation of the world, if red was a colour, the question would simply be meaningless, since it relies on the referring term ‘red’ that, as yet, has no referent. This idea does not violate the principle of bivalence since it is not the case that we have a proposition that fails to have a truth-value; instead we fail to have a proposition at all. We may as well talk nonsense (72).

God’s creation is radically novel; according to Robson, God is surprised by what he sees after creation.1 In the following review I will first summarize each of the book’s chapters, pointing out a few problematic points along the way. I will finish by pointing out two more general worries I have with the book as a whole.

The book is divided into three parts. The first part, "The Ontology of Creatio Ex Nihilo", comprises six chapters. In this part Robson discusses the ontology of creation ex nihilo and possibility, arguing that views including possible worlds or individuals are wrong-headed. Robson begins the first chapter by arguing that Leibniz had a determinate view of possibility; that is, he argues that Leibniz thought that, prior to creation, God could pick out a fully determinate Adam from all the possible individuals he could create. Robson’s example of a champion of determinate possibility is Alvin Plantinga. For Plantinga, there are complete, consistent possible worlds, each of which is fully determinate, and all of which God has before his mind’s eye in creation. He goes on in the second half of this chapter to raise problems for determinate possibility. One such problem, alleges Robson, is that actualization, on the determinate view of possibility, is a species of copying. God chooses a possible world and copies it out into actuality; he later calls this “the idea of God as the great photocopier” (50). Robson claims that if creation is merely a copying of what is already there, creation seems less glamorous: “If there is this perfectly determinate conception of Adam it is hard to see exactly what God’s creation is all about and why it is so amazing” (15).

Robson devotes the second chapter to arguing that there is a broad agreement among contemporary modal theories that possibility is determinate. His conclusion, that most people in the contemporary debate on possibility view possibility as determinate, is correct, but so uncontroversial that it hardly seems to merit a chapter-length treatment.

In Chapter Three, Robson draws on the work of C. S. Pierce and Charles Hartshorne to present his rival account of possibility as indeterminate. According to this view, there are no possible worlds or possible individuals. Possibility is not determinate, nor are truths about possibility, at least prior to creation. Much of this chapter is exegetical work on the views of Pierce and Hartshorne. Robson begins with Pierce’s understanding of a continuum. Whereas Cantor viewed continua as being composed of an infinite multitude of discrete parts, Pierce favors a view where continua are partless. Robson writes of Pierce’s view:

the nature of continuity precludes the idea that it is made up from or composed by a set of points or individual discrete entities. Such an idea does not do justice to the smoothness and the uninterrupted nature of a continuum (43).

Pierce extends this understanding of continua to possibility. For instance, there is a continuum of color, but there are no determinate possible color shades that make up that continuum of colors prior to creation. Robson then draws on Hartshorne’s development of Piercean views to flesh out his own account.

Chapter Four examines the similarities and differences between the indeterminateness Robson describes and the topic of vagueness, primarily as it is discussed by Timothy Williamson. Robson concludes, again I think rather uncontroversially, that vagueness is not the same as indeterminateness. Vagueness has to do with blurry boundaries of objects or concepts (whether the blur is ontological or epistemic or something else). The indeterminateness that he discusses, however, does not require blurred boundaries; indeterminateness requires that there be no objects of the relevant sort at all, blurry or otherwise.

In the fifth chapter Robson responds to potential objections to his view of possibility as indeterminate. One such problem he dubs “the problem of imagined possibilities”: it appears that we can imagine determinate possibilities, but what are we imagining if there are no such determinate possibilities? Robson responds to this problem by positing a form of combinatorialism: we can imagine possibilities insofar as our imagination can combine together things we have already experienced. By combining a horse and a horn, for example, both of which I have seen, I can imagine a unicorn. Robson explains, “The determinateness of the mental picture that arises before the imagination depends upon the determinateness and the individuality of the actual things” (76). One wonders here: what of things that are not combinatorially constructible out of anything actual, or out of any type of thing that is actual — things known in the literature as ‘aliens’. Surely we can’t imagine such things in the sense of forming mental images of them. Our inability to form mental images of aliens shouldn’t be a problem, though, since Robson says that what he claims here about imagination is also applicable to conceivability (see the first footnote in this chapter). We can consider the thought “that aliens are possible”. When we do so, it appears that we are entertaining a proposition about determinate possibility. But, for Robson, since we can’t combinatorially construct an alien, we can’t really consider a determinate possibility about one. So we aren’t considering a determinate possibility; we aren’t even considering something meaningful. But that seems false.

In Chapter Six Robson argues that the continua he posits in explaining possibility are to be identified with the powers and capacities of God. He reasons that it would not do to put the possibility continua outside of God, since then, Robson claims, creation ex nihilo would not be taken in a serious enough sense. If God’s looking to possible worlds outside of himself is not taking creation ex nihilo seriously, his looking to continua outside of himself is not either.

Chapter Seven marks the beginning of the second part of the book, "Providential Aspects of Creatio Ex Nihilo", where Robson focuses on how the indeterminate theory of possibility affects theories of providence. In chapter seven, Robson discusses various views of providence, including those of Augustine, Aquinas, and Leibniz, and shows how each requires God to know determinate possibilities prior to creation. In this chapter Robson claims that the Thomistic view of providence (in particular the distinction between primary and secondary causation) collapses all causing and intending into God’s causing and intending: when a man intends and does something, “ultimately the true and deep explanation is that God wanted him to” do it (123). In a footnote in this section, Robson finishes with the following startling claim about traditional views of providence like Aquinas’:

It seems to me that in these ‘pancausal’ accounts of providence we have a kind of purposive pantheism. There are no real purposes except God’s purposes, no real intentions except God’s … My very soul, that is, the very centre of my deliberations, is merely an aspect or modification of God (124).

Robson provides no argument for this assertion that a Thomistic theory of providence entails that his soul is a modification of God.

In Chapter Eight, Robson discusses the ramifications of his theory of possibility on theories of providence. Because, prior to creation, there are no truths or even propositions about any determinate possibilities, God lacks infallible, complete foreknowledge. God even lacks knowledge of what his different capacities for creation could create: “once a particular power or capacity to create is explored in God’s creative activity (i.e. after creation), then, God can see what that particular continuum will produce” (130). Only after God starts activating his capacities to create does he gain knowledge of what sorts of things he can create with those capacities.

Here is how I imagine the situation in which God finds himself on this view: God is confronted with a large (perhaps infinite) number of levers (i.e., continua or capacities), each of which, in some sense, is a part of God. Each lever has a large (perhaps infinite) number of possible positions (i.e., actualizations of that capacity), and, for any position, if the lever is put to that position, it will produce something or other.2 God, however, does not know which lever does what. In fact, he doesn’t even have a list of things the levers could do. It isn’t that he knows that one produces colors and another elephants; he doesn’t even know of colors or elephants. The only way he learns which lever does what and which position on each lever does what is by trial and, if not error, at least observation. Then, after pulling levers, he can tell what each lever is for, and what general sort of thing it creates. In creating, God pulls lots of levers.

Robson discusses the providential implications for his indeterminate possibility view in the eighth and ninth chapters. One alleged implication is that “God could not plan creation in the complete and determinate sense that Leibniz supposes” (131). Because of this “God cannot — logically cannot — create the best possible world” (131). Both of these alleged implications are false. There might be reasons for thinking that God cannot create a best possible world — many have argued that there is no such upper boundary on good worlds, for instance — but the indeterminate view of possibility is not one of them. Why couldn’t God take some time and test all the levers prior to his creation of this world? Then he could catalogue their effects, the compossibility relations between their effects, and his level of appreciation for each thing created, filling in combinatorial constructions where necessary. In fact, he could create a catalogue of all the maximal, consistent groupings of things, and he could call each of these a “possible world”. As for all those things created in his test runs, God could simply annihilate them, or he could keep some of them around for putting into his forthcoming finished product. It seems possible that God could do this, and if he had done this, then God could have planned creation in a complete and determinate sense.

Another alleged implication of the indeterminate theory of possibility is introduced in Chapter Eight, but discussed in detail in Chapter Nine, which concludes the second part of the book. In it, Robson claims that due to the indeterminate theory of possibility, chance is an integral part of creation, since God cannot plan his creation. Robson writes:

is it a welcome consequence that the specifics of creation are left to chance in the sense that the actual colours, the actual people, the actual everything is not planned? That this is a consequence of the Peirce and Hartshorne account cannot be denied (149).

Nevertheless, as we have seen, this consequence can be denied, provided that it is possible that God could perform test runs to learn what he is capable of prior to creating this world, with its actual colors and people. Even if we grant, for the sake of argument, that God’s first shot at creation brings with it novelty, surprise, and risk, there is no reason provided in this book that the world we inhabit is, in fact, God’s first shot at creating things. How would one prove that?

In the third part of the book, "Creativity and Creatio Ex Nihilo“, Robson investigates the general concept of creation and argues that God doesn’t just create the world, he also creates meaning as well. Chapter Ten includes an analysis of creation and an interesting discussion of God’s reasons for creating. The analysis of creation includes a discussion of human artistic creation and the creative powers God has given to humans.

”NDPRBodyTexT0">The final chapter is a discussion of God’s ability to create not only the things of the physical and spiritual world but also meanings. The first half of the chapter is an explication of semantic externalism; this discussion is then applied to God’s creation of meanings, which God creates by creating other things. God gives meaning to statements about Adam, for instance, by creating Adam, thus making thoughts about Adam possible (203-204).

At this point I will step back and raise two broad critiques of the book as a whole. One tension a reader finds in this book arises from Robson’s affirmation that all of mathematics is actual and determinate, and immutably so. Two plus two has always equaled four; there was no time at which that became true (see page 82, footnote 17). Furthermore, it would be a strange view that said that truths and propositions about addition stopped at some arbitrary high number, that N+1 is determinate and meaningful, but (N+1)+1 is indeterminate and meaningless (58-59). To safeguard the eternal and immutable character of mathematical truths, we must suppose that they are determinate and actual. Robson writes: “When our finite minds explore the world of mathematics we are exploring the determinate conceptions of God” (59). It seems, however, that analogous reasoning would support the inclusion of possible worlds in the conceptions of God. One might think that it is possible that God create Robson, and that this was true immutably prior to creation. There was no time at which it became true. Also, one might think that it would be strange if God knew some truths of possibility but not all truths of possibility. The upshot is this: intuitions analogous to those that lead Robson to affirming the actuality and determinateness of mathematics in the conceptions of God will lead his opponents to affirm actual and determinate possible worlds in the conceptions of God.

A second general critique is that in providing his positive account in this book, Robson very often does the following: he discusses the views of one or more thinkers, does some exegetical work to get clear on the position the thinker (or thinkers) held, then goes on to adopt that view, adapting it slightly. For instance, Robson does exegetical work on Pierce’s and Hartshorne’s writings, finds a position, then adapts and adopts it in Chapter Three. In Chapter Ten, he presents the work of Carl Hausman and Henri Bergson, gleans some thoughts about creation from it, and applies them to his work. The problem with this approach, however, is that the arguments in defense of the positive theses are light.

Robson discusses an interesting possibility in this book: God’s creation is not guided by any knowledge of creaturely possibilities; there was no such knowledge to be had prior to creation. While I would have liked more by way of arguments for his key theses, I find Robson’s alternate ontology of possibility and his identification of capacities with continua interesting and worthy of discussion in the contemporary debates on the intersection of modality and theism.3

1 Robson thinks that God changes, and “that divine timelessness is contrary to the Biblical witness and merely a discardable part of Hellenist influence” (188). In this review, I will follow Robson in applying temporal language to God.

2 As we have seen, Robson claims that continua are partless, so, strictly speaking, there wouldn’t be any number of positions for the lever. There must, however, be some sense to be made of why the capacity for color produces, say, red and not blue in a particular instance. Whatever it is about the continuum and its exercise that distinguishes red exercises of the capacity from blue exercises, it is those things that map on to the positions of the levers.

3 Thanks to Faith Glavey Pawl, Eleonore Stump, and Joshua Tepley for comments and suggestions on this review.