Ontology Made Easy

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Amie L. Thomasson, Ontology Made Easy, Oxford University Press, 2015, 345pp., $53.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199385119.

Reviewed by Matti Eklund, Uppsala University


Amie L. Thomasson lays out in a lively and clear fashion her preferred view on ontological questions, traces it back to Rudolf Carnap, and compares and contrasts the view with many competing views from the literature. The book is a continuation of earlier themes in Thomasson’s work, including her (2007) Ordinary Objects. But while she defends the same type of metaontological view here as in earlier work, there is not a huge amount of actual overlap, and Thomasson here discusses issues left open by, or only relatively briefly dealt with in, earlier discussions.

I will mainly focus on Thomasson’s main claims and arguments, and critically discuss them. There is much else of value in the book. Among other things, she discusses how Carnap is best interpreted (ch. 1), and she discusses various alternatives to her own view, including fictionalism (ch. 5), Thomas Hofweber’s view (ch. 9), Karen Bennett’s suggestion that the answers to central metaphysical disputes may be unknowable (ch. 4), Eli Hirsch’s thesis of quantifier variance (ch. 4), as well as the view, associated with for example Ted Sider, that ontological questions are not best conceived of as framed in terms of the ordinary notion of existence but in terms of a technical notion of existence (ch. 10). While this review will focus on criticisms of the book, I happily recommend it to readers interested in ontological and metaontological debates. Thomasson lays out an interesting case for an important view on ontological questions. In the course of so doing she also provides an overview of alternative views, and sometimes, e.g. in the case of fictionalism, the remarks she makes about those views are significant in their own right.

Here is Thomasson’s main argument and thesis in roughest outline. Ontological sentences — sentences about what there is — must in order to be meaningful be governed by rules of use. But if they are so governed then ontological questions are answerable either conceptually or empirically. Ontology is in this way easy: ontological questions can be answered by conceptual and empirical means. By means of “easy arguments” appealing to these rules of use one can reason one’s way from philosophically uncontroversial premises to the existence of what are otherwise seen as philosophically controversial entities. For example, one can argue from “the house is red” to “the house has the property of being red”, and from “There are five books on the table” to “The number of books on the ”background:white">table is five" (pp. 251f). More theoretical metaphysical arguments are just not called for. There is also another sense in which ontology can be said to be “easy” on Thomasson’s view: it is easy to exist. For most ontological debates over whether some entities, the Fs, exist, the side that affirms the existence of Fs is in the right. I will shortly return to this latter kind of easiness.

When Thomasson says that ontological questions, when “well-formed”, are answerable conceptually or empirically, the view is not merely that when they are answerable they are so answerable: the view is that they are always so answerable. She says, e.g., “This leaves us with a view that makes existence questions ‘easy’ to answer in the sense that it enables those existence questions that are well formed to be answered straightforwardly by conceptual and/or empirical work” (p. 125; compare too e.g. pp. 158f, 303). Faced with this general claim about existence questions, it is natural to seek counterexamples. Katherine Hawley (forthcoming) mentions one. Take the hypothesis that there are other concrete worlds, causally and spatiotemporally isolated from ours (the things Lewis identifies as non-actual possible worlds). Surely this hypothesis is meaningful, and the question of whether this hypothesis is true is an ontological question which does not seem resolvable conceptually or empirically.

Seeming counterexamples aside, what is supposed to justify Thomasson’s assumption that if ontological sentences are meaningful and so governed by rules of use then they are answerable conceptually or empirically? One may suspect that she assumes that all meaningful truth-apt sentences are such that their truth-values can be established conceptually or empirically. But if this is what she is assumes, there is a tension in her discussion. For while she explicitly says she derives inspiration from Carnap, she disavows the commitment to verificationism (ch. 1, passim). But the thesis that all meaningful truth-apt sentences can get their truth-values established conceptually or empirically certainly sounds verificationist in spirit. Of course, it does not immediately commit her to claims such as that a sentence’s meaning is its method of verification, but it is still a thesis associated with a bygone era, and a radical thesis many theorists today would disavow. If instead Thomasson thinks some specific feature common to ontological sentences makes it the case that these sentences can be assessed either conceptually or empirically although this does not go for all sentences, she does not say what this feature might be. What she does do is discuss a certain number of ontological disputes and give reason to think that in these cases the disputes can be answered by conceptual or empirical means. Perhaps what she thinks is that this gives us inductive reason to think that this will go for all ontological disputes. But if her strategy is this inductive one, it might have been worth trying to seek out the most promising counterexamples to this general claim, such as the one Hawley brings up.

A recurring theme is that her view promises to avoid epistemological mystery (of the kind orthodox ontologists’ views invite): it does not require there to be non-empirical, non-conceptual means of figuring out the answers to ontological questions. But for this to matter, we had better not have reason from other domains of inquiry to believe that some questions can be answered by non-empirical, non-conceptual means. (Just to mention some examples, one might think that some mathematical and some moral knowledge is both non-empirical and non-conceptual.) For if we have such independent reason, then we will anyway be committed to epistemic methods of the kind the serious ontologist relies on. Again it seems that Thomasson must rely on a general assumption that goes beyond ontology.

When, in chapter 2, she lays out her overall view, Thomasson centrally focuses on the following supposed “core rule of use” for “exists”:

E: Ks exist iff the application conditions actually associated with ‘K’ are fulfilled. (p. 86)

Thomasson calls this a deflationary characterization of “exists”, and she compares how deflationists about truth say that truth is characterized by some schema like “‘p’ is true if and only if p”. I gather that the idea behind Thomasson’s reliance on (E) is this. Given that this is a core rule of use for “exists”, “Ks exist” cannot itself be among the application conditions associated with ‘K’. Hence we get a kind of reductive explanation of talk of the existence of Ks in terms of the application conditions associated with the sortal ‘K’. Given this reductive explanation, existence questions, when well-formed, are answerable by conceptual and empirical means: we just need to figure out whether the relevant application conditions are satisfied.

But first, if, as some aspects of her discussion suggest, Thomasson relies on a general assumption to the effect that all genuine questions are answerable by conceptual and empirical means, then these details appear otiose as far as defense of Thomasson’s overall view on ontology is concerned. Second, as Thomasson recognizes, not all terms can be associated with rules of use that are statable without employing the term or some synonym. However, the claim that all meaningful expressions are associated with such rules of use faces obvious regress worries. A way of getting out of the regress that Thomasson gestures toward is ostension (p. 92). But this only addresses how to deal with some meaningful terms whose rules of use cannot be non-trivially stated. The basic logical terms seem also to fall into this category. In that case the appeal to ostension seems out of place. And the case of basic logical terms is relevant since many would suspect that “exists” belongs in the same category: witness the whole tradition of viewing so-called existential quantification as expressing existence. Third, “exists” occurs in other kinds of statements too, and its function there is not explained by (E). There is a question of how to account not only for truths of the form “Ks exist” but also for various generalizations. (E) is no help there. (On this latter issue, compare Dan Korman (forthcoming).)

Statements to the effect that if the application conditions associated with ‘K’ are satisfied then Ks exist are supposed by Thomasson to be “conceptual truths”. This is most explicit in chapter 7, where conceptual truth is the main topic. Thomasson thus relies on a notion of conceptual truth and takes it upon herself to reply to doubts about the notion. I will devote the rest of the review to aspects of her discussion of this. I believe that there are problems here, and that these problems go to the heart of her project.

Thomasson (2007) replied to Quine’s arguments casting doubt on the idea of conceptual truth. In the present book she responds to Timothy Williamson’s (2007) arguments. Like Williamson, she employs Paul Boghossian’s (1996) celebrated distinction between metaphysical and epistemic analyticity. Metaphysical analyticity is truth by virtue of meaning alone; whereas a statement is epistemically analytic “provided that grasp of its meaning alone suffices for justified belief in its truth” (p. 236). Metaphysical analyticity is seen by many theorists, for example Boghossian himself, as more suspicious than epistemic analyticity. Thomasson says (p. 236) that she only needs a notion of epistemic analyticity, and she focuses on discussing criticisms of that notion.

The notion of epistemic analyticity, as discussed by for example Boghossian, is an amalgam of two ideas. One is that semantic competence with some expressions involves dispositions to accept certain things as true and valid; another is that we are epistemically justified in our acceptance of these things. Williamson centrally criticizes the former idea. Thomasson evades Williamson’s criticism by not relying on the idea that semantic competence is a matter of what one is disposed to accept, but instead on claims about what inferences competent speakers are entitled to make (pp. 238f). The notion of epistemic analyticity she defends is then not exactly Boghossian’s. Instead Thomasson’s view is like that of Kevin Scharp (2013, ch. 2).) I will not evaluate her response to Williamson directly. Instead I will discuss what work her preferred notion of epistemic analyticity can and cannot do.

How robust is the entitlement supposed to be? Compare two possibilities. One is that competence confers defeasible entitlement, but whether the competent speaker is entitled full stop depends on further facts about her epistemic situation. Another is that the competent speaker is entitled to make the inference regardless of other facts about her epistemic situation. I submit that the former, weaker claim is more reasonable. To relate to examples like the ones Thomasson uses: even the inference from “the house is red” to “the house has the property of being red” is defeasible. A speaker who has it on the testimony from a nominalist interlocutor who is known generally to be very reliable about philosophical matters that there are no properties may all things considered be entitled to accept the former but not the latter. (One might also ask how entitlement is related to justification and knowledge. Thomasson does not discuss the matter explicitly.)

Here is a different, albeit related, question about epistemic analyticity. Consider two statements P and Q such that the inference from P to Q is epistemically analytic. Can it not be that despite this, P is true but Q is false? The mere fact that this epistemic relation holds between P and Q does not by itself guarantee anything about the truth-values of the statements. Further argument is needed to establish that if the inference from P to Q is epistemically analytic then, necessarily, Q is true if P is. These questions are especially pressing if, as I suggested, the entitlement conferred by epistemic analyticity is merely defeasible, but the questions arise either way. Several theorists have recently adopted the view that there are sentences which are epistemically analytic but non-true, and inferences which are epistemically analytic but fail to be truth-preserving. (The most elaborate recent defense is in Scharp (2013). I have defended this sort of view myself in, e.g., my (2002).)

Thomasson might reply that even if this may be possible for all that has been said, further considerations rule this out. The application conditions plausibly associated with, say, “table” (to use an example she often uses herself) are such that not only are we entitled to infer that tables exist from the assumption that the application conditions associated with “table” are satisfied, but it also is the case that given that these application conditions are satisfied, there are tables. But there are complications. Compare God. In the course of a discussion of what her view commits her to as regards the existence of God (ch. 8), she says “Introducing that term must not analytically entail anything statable in unextended L that was not already analytically entailed by truths stated in L” (p. 263). This is a well-known kind of conservativeness requirement, where such requirements state, roughly, that stipulations introducing new expressions must not upset what held in the language prior to the stipulations. She then notes that God is supposed to be or have been causally active but application conditions yielding this would not satisfy this conservativeness requirement: so her ontological view does not commit her to the existence of God (p. 264). However, even if she is right about this, note that just as it is part of our conception of God that God is causally efficacious, it is part of our conception of tables that tables are causally efficacious. Does not the postulation of the existence of tables then violate the conservativeness requirement as much as the postulation of the existence of God does? In fact, one prominent philosophical concern about the existence of macroscropic objects like tables is that they bring causal overdetermination in their wake (see e.g. Trenton Merricks (2001)). Thomasson only discussed causal overdetermination in her (2007), and it is worth comparing what she said there. I will return to the significance of these points as far as the present work is concerned.

 Thomasson (2007) said that causal overdetermination is a problem only where the overdetermining causes are suitably independent, and “One clear case in which the independence condition fails for entities x and y is when claims of x’s causal relevance analytically entail claims of y’s causal relevance” (p. 16). She holds that when φ analytically entails ψ, then “ψ requires no more of the world for its truth than φ already required — sufficient truth-makers in the world for φ are also sufficient truth-makers in the world for ψ, they just make a new claim ψ” (p. 16). But this latter claim is a claim about the metaphysical relation between φ and ψ, and thus Thomasson relies on metaphysical analyticity. It is the appeal to metaphysical analyticity — not a mere claim about an epistemic relation between statements — that allows Thomasson to claim that the simples arranged baseballwise and the baseball aren’t in causal competition. If y does not demand anything more of the world than f does, then f and y do not make competing demands on the world. By contrast, if f and y are only claimed to stand in an epistemic relationship it is by no means clear that this conclusion follows. All this is to say: as is clearer from her earlier work, Thomasson wishes to make certain claims regarding analytic entailment and its consequences that are justified only if by “analyticity” she does not merely have in mind epistemic analyticity but something which is more metaphysically loaded.

If Thomasson really relies only on epistemic analyticity, and is only committed to competent speakers having defeasible entitlement, then her view is compatible with orthodox, non-deflationary approaches to metaphysics. Traditional metaphysical arguments, of the kind Thomasson seeks to do an end run around, are still as relevant as before: they can in principle defeat the entitlement that we do have for, e.g., our belief in ordinary objects, and our belief in numbers and properties. Compare perhaps a different view than Thomasson’s, one on which its being part of common sense that p means that we are defeasibly justified in believing that p. This view would quite clearly not have the consequence that traditional metaphysical arguments are somehow less relevant than we thought them to be. The arguments can be such that on balance we should not believe what common sense says. What I am suggesting about Thomasson’s view is that it threatens to be no different in that regard.


Many thanks to Dan Korman, Jonathan Shaheen and Amie Thomasson for helpful comments.


Boghossian, Paul: 1996, “Analyticity Reconsidered”, Noûs 30: 360-91.

Eklund, Matti: 2002, “Inconsistent Languages”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 64: 251-75.

Hawley, Katherine: forthcoming, “Comments on Ontology Made Easy”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research.

Korman, Dan: forthcoming, “Easy Ontology and Deflationary Metaontology”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research.

Merricks, Trenton: 2001, Objects and Persons, Oxford University Press.

Scharp, Kevin: 2013, Replacing Truth, Oxford University Press.

Thomasson, Amie: 2007, Ordinary Objects, Oxford University Press.

Williamson, Timothy: 2007, The Philosophy of Philosophy, Blackwell.