Ontology, Modality, and Mind: Themes from the Metaphysics of E. J. Lowe

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Alexander Carruth, Sophie Gibb, and John Heil (eds.), Ontology, Modality, and Mind: Themes from the Metaphysics of E. J. Lowe, Oxford University Press, 2018, 195pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198796299.

Reviewed by Jonathan Tallant, University of Nottingham


This volume of papers, edited by Alexander Carruth, Sophie Gibb and John Heil, is dedicated to the memory of the late E. J. (Jonathan) Lowe. From the outset in this review, I should declare an interest: as a former PhD student of Jonathan's, I have a particular emotional investment in this volume that may not be shared by all.

In outline, the book contains a range of papers that engage with aspects of Jonathan's collected philosophical works, as well as a paper on metaphysics by Jonathan himself. The (acknowledged) challenges facing the editors in putting together this volume include the breadth of Jonathan's corpus of works as well as the fact that he defended a 'big picture' philosophical system, such that any one part of it was connected to others in interesting and subtle ways. It would be impossible to select papers that both introduced and engaged with all aspects of that system. As such, the editors (rightly, in my view) have selected papers that pick up on a range of different topics from the broad themes of Ontology, Modality and Mind.

Working through from the front matter, the volume opens with some introductory material from Heil -- more of which a little later on. The reader is then presented with a paper of Lowe's defending his view that metaphysics is to be treated as the science of essence. We then come to the papers on Ontology. In order, we have Peter Simons' paper on the primacy of metaphysics and how to draw categorical distinctions, Heil's essay on the nature of particulars and universals, and Anna Marmadoro's paper that engages with Lowe's objections to hylomorphism. Shifting then to Modality, we're presented primarily with considerations of essence and modality: David S. Oderberg considers the contingency/necessity of physical laws and Lowe's distinction between metaphysical and physical necessity; Tuomas E. Tahko takes on the epistemology of essence, and Antonella Corradini extends Lowe's discussion of essence to the normative realm. Closing the section on modality, Peter van Inwagen takes issue with Lowe's Ontological Argument. Then we move on to Mind. Carruth and Gibb explore how Lowe's model of psychophysical causation might render compatible physical causal closure and interactive substance dualism about the mind, and David Robb takes up the question of whether or not physical/mental causation might be 'invisible' -- not capable of physical methods of detection.

Here the reader can see, writ large, the challenge facing the editors. Even in picking out just the themes of ontology, modality and mind, it's abundantly clear that Lowe's philosophical scheme was so rich that this volume ends up covering an enormous amount of ground. The effect, on this reader at least, was that I felt myself wanting to dip in and out of the volume, as my interests shifted around. With the lack of conversation between the papers, I don't think I'd gain too much by studying the volume as a whole. Short of being narrower (and less rich) in their selections, I don't think that there's anything that the editors could have done about this.

So, who should read this? Philosophers working in any of the areas described ought to get something from engaging with some of the papers. The papers are good and interesting and the introductory material written by Heil very much sets the scene for what follows.

Those interested in Lowe scholarship more generally will also certainly get something from the volume as a whole, but they will almost certainly feel the absence of coverage in certain areas. If this volume were intended as a 'one stop shop' for Lowe's philosophical system, then I would have welcomed material on time and persistence; also good to see in such a volume would have been material on agency, philosophical logic, and a more detailed look at dependence -- though it does come up in places. Of course, that's fine. The editors don't set out to give a comprehensive sweep of Lowe's philosophical system, so, that they don't manage to provide one is in keeping with the book's being an excellent read. In part because of that, though, I don't think that this book is going to be the thing for you if you're seeking an introduction to Lowe's system. Even in the areas it does cover, the level is such that if it's Lowe's views you want, then I'd go directly to the source. (Helpfully, the volume also includes a bibliography of Jonathan's publications.)

On that score, let me say a little about the paper of Lowe's that appears in this volume. As noted above, Lowe's entry is concerned both with the nature of metaphysical inquiry and the nature of essence -- the two being entwined, for him. Begin with the claim that objects have essences. Essences are not entities. Rather, essences are identities -- 'the essence of something, X, is what X is, or what it is to be X' (p. 16). Such essences are required, in no small part, because in order to know whether or not X exists, one must know what sort of thing X is or might be -- and 'the sort of thing that X is' is, of course, its essence (p. 18). Essences cannot be entities. If every X had an essence that were itself an entity, then we would have an infinite regress of essences (p. 20). Essences can, it turns out, also serve as the basis for all modal truths. To illustrate, one way in which it can turn out that 'X is necessarily F' is by virtue of it being of X's essence that X is F. The example Lowe gives is that of spatial extension. We may say that X (a material object) is necessarily spatially extended. If it is true, then that is true is because it is of the essence of X to be spatially extended -- 'part of what it is to be a material object is to be something spatially extended' (p. 26).

In turn, this sort of approach facilitates a modal epistemology.

How, for example, do we know that two distinct things of suitably different kinds, such as a bronze statue and the lump of bronze composing it at any given time, can -- unlike two planets -- exist in the same place at the same time? Certainly not by looking very hard at what there is in that place at that time. Just by looking, we shall not see that two distinct things occupy that place. We know this, rather, because we know what a bronze statue is and what a lump of bronze is. We thereby know that these are different things and that a thing of the first sort must, at any given time, be composed by a thing of the second sort, since it is part of the essence of a bronze statue to be composed of bronze . . . they are facts about them we must grasp antecedently to being able to embark upon any such empirical inquiry concerning them. We can only inquire empirically into something's properties if we already know what it is we are examining. (p. 27)

This latter fact also explains, for Lowe, why metaphysics (the study of essence) precedes science. One must grasp the essence of an entity (which is the project of metaphysics) before empirically inquiring after its properties.

It is also worth noting that essence is supposed to give us reason to reject a possible worlds approach to modality -- particularly a 'Concretist' model, of the sort defended by David Lewis (1986). If such worlds exist, then they must be entities, and so must have essences (p. 31). If possible worlds have essences, then there are modal truths about them. These will include truths like 'possibly, there are infinitely many possible worlds' (p. 31). If that's true, then for someone following the standard Lewisian analysis of possible worlds, that would mean that there is a possible world that contains infinitely many possible worlds. But since 'worlds' are supposed to be nothing more than spatio-temporally connected collections of entities, it's hard to see how there could be a possible world that itself 'contains' infinitely many possible worlds. It thus follows that there are modal truths about possible worlds that must flow from essences and not from worlds. And, if we're prepared to allow that, then why not simply suppose that all modal truths flow from essences? (p. 32)

As is clear, there's a lot going on here, and I wonder what Jonathan would have had to say about some of these matters if given the opportunity to develop his views further. For instance, and just to focus in on his rejection of concrete worlds, it seems at least open to the Lewisian to adopt a slightly different analysis of 'world talk'. For instance, Bricker (2008) argues in favour of a modified Lewisian view according to which modal operators quantify over worlds and pluralities of worlds. This kind of approach would seem to lead at least in the direction of a solution to the problem Jonathan raises. 'Possibly, there are infinitely many possible worlds' would simply have to be read in such a way that the modal operators quantify over the plurality of worlds -- all infinitely many of them. I don't mean to suggest this as a straightforward solution to the problem (wrinkles may abound), but it would have been good to hear more from Jonathan about why this route is a no-go.[1]

However, I rather feel that in doing the conventional thing in this review -- telling the reader a little about the areas covered, trying to determine who might further their philosophical insight in particular areas, commenting on some of the ideas -- I miss the point. The volume is, as it sets out to be, dedicated to Jonathan's memory. And read through that lens, it's wonderful. Heil's introduction to some aspects of Jonathan's philosophical views is lovely and perfectly contextualises the material that follows. The Lowe that Heil describes (pp. 1-2) is the one that I remember: modest, kind, with a fearless intellect, and who is, still, very much missed. This framing -- and the papers contained within the volume -- are a timely reminder that philosophical work can be rigorous, insightful and demanding, whilst also being kind. It's hard to think of a more fitting tribute to Jonathan and his work.


Bricker, P. 2008. 'Concrete Possible Worlds', in Theodore Sider, John Hawthorne and Dean W. Zimmerman (eds.), Contemporary Debates in Metaphysics. Blackwell. pp. 111-134.

Lewis, D. 1986. On the Plurality of Worlds Oxford: Blackwell.

[1] I write this wondering whether in Jonathan's eleven monographs and two-hundred-plus articles there might not already be an answer to this question.