Oppression and Responsibility: a Wittgensteinian approach to social practices and moral theory

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O'Connor, Peg, Oppression and Responsibility: a Wittgensteinian approach to social practices and moral theory, Penn State University Press, 2002, 167pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0271022027.

Reviewed by Alessandra Tanesini, Cardiff University


In this book Peg O’Connor employs a broadly Wittgensteinian methodology to offer an account of various forms of political oppression and to develop a theory of moral responsibility. O’Connor recognizes that Wittgenstein’s approach to philosophy was intended to be purely descriptive, and on this matter she quickly parts company with him. But she believes that some of the concepts he explored, especially those of practice and of background, prove themselves to be extremely fruitful in the context of an investigation of those central issues in feminist moral and political philosophy with which O’Connor is concerned in this book.

One of O’Connor’s main contentions is that some forms of political oppression are largely invisible because they are part of a background of practices and assumptions which are hardly ever noticed or questioned (p. 6). Backgrounds provide the frame or worldview against which any of our doings and sayings acquires its significance. For instance, it is only in the context of complex practices, assumptions, habits and institutions that marking a piece of paper with a cross constitutes an instance of voting (p. 13). In a different context, a cross on a piece of paper could be a signature or a doodle. Backgrounds, for O’Connor, are multiple and partly overlapping. They also comprise ‘sets of power relations’ (p. 4) which can give rise to political oppression.

O’Connor’s analysis of oppression in terms of practices and backgrounds is often illuminating. For example, it succeeds in bringing out the full racist import of the burnings of African-American churches in the 1990s. Quite rightly, O’Connor points out that an act can be racist even though the agent had not fully articulated racist motives to act in the way she or he did. It is quite possible to act in a racist manner without being aware that this is what one is doing. One might fail to fully grasp one’s motives. Importantly, one could also fail to appreciate the significance of one’s actions within one’s current socio-cultural context.

The same analysis, however, also raises several questions that O’Connor does not address in sufficient detail. For instance, O’Connor writes that backgrounds are among the ‘conditions of possibility and intelligibility of actions’ (p. 2). The example of voting mentioned above helps to understand what such a claim might mean. Unless some practices and institutions are already in place, nothing I can do could possibly count as an instance of voting. This line of thought seems to lead to dangerous conclusions when we consider a different kind of case. O’Connor mentions marital rape (p. 37), but one could also think of the case of sexual harassment. In the context of many traditional understandings of the institution of marriage, marital rape seems to make no sense. If we take backgrounds to determine the significance of actions, then it would seem legitimate to say that in such traditional contexts nothing a husband could do to his wife would count as rape. Yet, I assume that O’Connor would agree with me when I say that simply because people at that time could not fully appreciate the significance of their actions, it does not follow that what they did was not rape.

There is a response to this objection which is available from within the Wittgensteinian framework adopted by O’Connor. It requires that one provide a normative account of practices. Practices, so conceived, are ways of doing things about which there is a right and a wrong. In other words, practices are rule-governed activities, although in some cases, as in children’s games, the practitioners make up the rules as they go along. Once we keep in mind this feature of practices, it becomes apparent that practitioners might make mistakes. They might fail to acknowledge the significance of their actions, and such failures could be due to the fact that they lack any means to make intelligible to themselves the meanings of their actions.

On these matters O’Connor is not sufficiently clear. On the one hand, she adopts a normative understanding of practices since she invokes the notions of rules, understanding and precepts to characterize them (p. 11). On the other hand, however, she claims, ‘the common agreement in action of a community fixes the meaning of a rule’ (p. 14). This account of rule-following ultimately reduces norms to facts about what the community as a whole implicitly takes to be correct. Given such an account, however, there could be contexts in which it would be correct to say that it is conceptually impossible for a husband to rape his wife. What O’Connor needs to avoid this unsavory conclusion is to reject the view that the meaning of an action is ever fixed by what anybody takes that meaning to be.

O’Connor provides her account of linguistic meaning in a chapter in which she addresses the topic of hate or assaultive speech. Meaning, she claims, is not determined by speaker’s intentions (p. 74, 78). Rather, words acquire their significance in the context of our discursive and non-discursive practices (p. 73). Thus, if we want to understand the meaning of an epithet—‘queer’, for instance—we are well advised, in the first instance, to look at the point of uttering this word on a given occasion. We need to ask about the purposes it serves in the context of our ways of life rather than search for the class of people the word might name or try to find out the intentions of the speaker.

O’Connor holds that this Wittgensteinian account of linguistic meaning helps us to appreciate the full import of hate speech because ‘it does not allow for the easy separation of the content of speech and its effects’ (p. 73). I am not altogether sure what O’Connor means by this claim. Wittgenstein himself makes it quite clear that not even all the intended effects of an utterance are relevant to its meaning (Philosophical Investigations § 498). Perhaps, O’Connor’s point is that a Wittgensteinian approach to language encourages us to consider the overall significance of many speech acts in the context of our lives rather than narrowly to focus on their linguistic meanings. Be that as it may, O’Connor’s insightful thesis is that advocates of free speech who rely on the metaphor of the marketplace of ideas are deeply mistaken about the nature of the backgrounds that make speech possible and intelligible.

O’Connor does not make her thesis entirely transparent, but what she suggests is along the following lines. Supporters of free speech do accept that when words are direct threats or incitements to riots, so that they cause immediate harm to others, one is not free to utter them (p. 70). They also agree that other forms of speech could be odious, but they claim that state censorship of ideas is a much worse ill than allowing hateful utterances to be heard (p. 70). They reach this conclusion, in part, because they assume nobody else is silenced by this form of speech. The metaphor of the marketplace of ideas encourages the thought that nothing anybody can say can make it impossible for other ideas to be thinkable. It encourages the thought that the only way of silencing opponents is physically to prevent them from speaking or their ideas from being circulated. What O’Connor’s Wittgensteinian approach demonstrates is that there are backgrounds against which some ideas cannot be made intelligible. Hate or assaultive speech restricts and shapes the range of thoughts that can be articulated today. It is more harmful, and more directly so, than supporters of free speech assume.

Whilst these considerations are important and succeed in showing the obfuscating nature of the metaphor of the marketplace of ideas, they do not in my opinion settle the issue at hand. It is perfectly possible that, despite the harm caused by assaultive speech, state intervention in the form of legislation about which forms of speech are permissible would nevertheless be more pernicious. Although in general we want our legislation to prohibit immoral acts, political considerations sometimes dictate a different stance. For instance, it is plausible to claim that pornography harms women, yet it is in my opinion unadvisable to depend on the state to ban it, since the most likely effect of such a ban would be the confiscation of gay erotic material. This is precisely what happened in Canada. Similarly, although it is clear that hate speech causes much harm, I don’t believe that a situation in which the state is given the power to monitor what citizens are allowed to say would be much better. The state is, after all, hardly a staunch defender of powerless minorities. Were legislation to be introduced, I would not be surprised if some hip-hop lyrics were the first form of speech to be banned.

This last point brings me to my only complaint about this engaging and well thought-out book. O’Connor subsumes politics to ethics. This is particularly in evidence in the second half of the book where she develops her account of moral responsibility and argues for the claim that white people qua white are responsible for racism (p. 112). O’Connor is aware that in the current climate it is not possible for any person not to have racist attitudes (p. 120). Since attributions of responsibility normally presume that one could have acted otherwise, O’Connor’s position appears odd.

There is no problem with attributing responsibility to people for some of the things they might have done unintentionally. But, these are always cases in which they could have acted otherwise than they did. And, perhaps, they should have known better. The example we are asked to consider is different, since there is nothing each one of us can do to avoid holding racist attitudes.

O’Connor’s position could be made to square with the requirement of autonomy, if we take her to be concerned exclusively with collective responsibility. The whole group of white people is responsible, and as a group they could have acted otherwise; had they done so, history would have been different. But no individual is responsible, because no single person could have significantly changed the way things evolved. O’Connor seems at times to endorse this reading of her position (p. 131), but since she explicitly rejects the autonomy requirement (pp. 119-20), this interpretation cannot be correct. Instead, she appears to hold the view that each one of us is responsible for any attitude, action, or practice which he or she holds, causes, brings about or sustains. In other words, each individual is responsible for anything whose coming into being or whose preservation is caused either intentionally or unintentionally by that person. This view sounds odd to modern ears, but it was held by the Greeks. Oedipus famously was considered responsible of parricide even though he did it unintentionally, and he could not have acted otherwise than he did.

Suppose now that we accept O’Connor’s claim that white people qua white people are morally responsible for racism. How does it help? It is of course important that individual white people do not think of themselves as immune to pervasive pernicious attitudes. It is also important that they reflect on the undeserved benefits they are recipients of purely in virtue of the perceived color of their skins. But the focus on ethics and the responsibility of individual white citizens also hinders the cause of the fight against racism. It focuses attention away from the responsibility of the state, and of giant corporations. It obscures the fact that political problems require political solutions.