Ordinary Objects

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Amie L. Thomasson, Ordinary Objects, Oxford University Press, 2007, 240pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195319910.

Reviewed by Terry Horgan, University of Arizona


There are various arguments in metaphysics purporting to show that numerous kinds of objects recognized by common sense and by everyday discourse -- e.g., tables, baseballs, cabbages, kings -- are not real. Sir Arthur Eddington propounded one such argument in 1928: what is really in front of me when I think a table is there is not a substantial object at all, but mostly emptiness together with sparsely interspersed particles rapidly rushing about; hence, tables and other such common-sense objects do not exist.

More recent arguments for much the same conclusion include the following. (1) All the effects normally attributed to baseballs and stars and other composite objects are really the cooperative products of fundamental subatomic entities of physics, such as quarks. Since there is no "causal work" left for the putative composite entities to perform, there are in fact no such entities (there are no baseballs, only "fundamental particles arranged baseballwise"). (2) Real composite entities must obey a general, systematic principle of composition, e.g., the principle that "several objects compose another object when and only when each is in contact with one of the others". But the putative composite objects posited in everyday discourse do not obey any such principle. When two people are shaking hands, for instance, they do not jointly constitute a composite object; so putative "ordinary objects" are not real. (3) No two objects could be composed of exactly the same parts at the same level of composition; hence there is no such object as a statue, over and above the lump of clay of which it is composed. Thus, statues do not really exist; and likewise, mutatis mutandis, for numerous other putative ordinary objects. (4) Putative ordinary objects, if they exist, are vague in certain ways -- e.g., vague with respect to which bits of matter compose them and which do not, and vague with respect to their spatiotemporal boundaries. But ontological vagueness (as distinct from semantic vagueness) is impossible. Hence, there are no ordinary objects.

In Ordinary Objects, Amie Thomasson mounts a spirited and vigorous defense of the reality of ordinary objects. She maintains that negative arguments like those just canvassed, despite their diversity in origin and in superficial form, exhibit similar problems arising from questionable background assumptions about matters of meaning, reference, possibility, and necessity. Such assumptions include the view that it makes sense to use words like 'thing' and 'object' in a perfectly general and generic way, and the view that it makes sense to ask (when using the words this way) which kinds of things or objects really exist. Thomasson holds, in opposition to these two assumptions, that fully meaningful uses of such words depend on their being explicitly or implicitly governed, in context, by more specific categories, e.g., "furniture item" or "governmental agency" or "dancing style." This allows her to reply to argument (2), for instance, this way:

if we interpret generic existence questions as using 'thing' or object' in an entirely 'neutral' sense, we have reason to think that they are incomplete and unanswerable … and the failure to find a uniform answer [to the question when several objects compose another object] that yields the objects of common sense would be no reflection on the issue of whether or not those objects exist, but reflect only the fact that the question is ill formed. (p. 136)

Other background assumptions concern the allegedly universal applicability of certain plausible-looking principles. One such assumption is the universal applicability of the principle that there is no systematic "causal redundancy" in the world. Thomasson argues that this principle really only applies with respect to objects or events that are independent of one another -- whereas a baseball, for example, is not independent of the particles that collectively compose it. Because of this part/whole metaphysical dependence, she maintains, the statement that atoms "arranged baseballwise" caused a window-shattering actually entails that a baseball caused the shattering. Thus, although something is certainly amiss with saying that the baseball and the atoms arranged baseballwise both caused the window's shattering, the problem here is not falsity but rather "that conjoining items on a list with 'and' (especially where this is rendered with 'both' … ) normally presupposes that the items conjoined are separate and independent, but that presupposition is violated in cases like these" (p. 13). This is her reply to argument (1).

Another, related, background assumption is the universal applicability of the principle that no two objects can be composed of exactly the same parts at the same level of composition. Here too, she argues, the principle really only applies vis-à-vis independent objects or events -- whereas a statue is not independent of the parts that compose it. So, contrary to argument (3), the statue is real, and is distinct from (though not independent of) the lump of clay.

The primary role of metaphysical inquiry, as Thomasson sees things, "is to undertake a certain kind of conceptual analysis, not to engage in deep discoveries about what really exists, or what things there really are" (p. 201). The core of such conceptual analysis is to ascertain what category given words -- e.g., 'spatula' and 'nation' -- belong to, what the conditions are under which the category is applicable, and when identity statements are licensed under the category. Existence claims and identity claims about ordinary objects fare just fine when such conceptual analysis is properly executed. Given this take on the nature of metaphysics, she replies as follows to argument (4):

It is the indeterminacies in the criteria of identity and persistence associated with … categorial terms that can lead to certain claims about the identity or composition of the objects referred to being indeterminate in truth-value. And claims that it is indeterminate whether these are parts of the object, or whether the object still exists, or whether these objects are identical … may then be trivially transformed into claims about objects having vague boundaries, and so on … . [T]he kind of vagueness in the world that we must posit to accept ordinary objects … is indeed a kind of anodyne vagueness that still explains the vagueness in our world in terms of the vagueness in our representations. (p. 106)

Two fundamental contentions in Thomasson's approach to metaphysics are (i) that the notions of analytic truth and analytic entailment make good sense despite the influential arguments of Quine and Quineans, and (ii) that there are pervasive analytic entailments among various statements expressible in our language. To my mind, her vigorous defense of these claims is quite plausible.

Another fundamental contention is that "the truth-value of claims of existence and nonexistence depends on the category of entity speakers intend to refer to, and cannot be evaluated except with respect to some presupposed category or other" (p. 47). This claim I find far less plausible, and the book contains little by way of systematic defense of it. Also, it appears to me that a daunting regress problem threatens her position, a problem she never acknowledges or addresses. Consider first this passage, in which she sets forth the so-called "qua problem" concerning reference-grounding for a new singular term, and in which she introduces the correlative notions of application conditions and coapplication conditions:

Pure causal theories [of singular reference] may seem plausible enough as long as we implicitly confine our discussion, for example, to names of people. But the qua problem arises once we acknowledge that there are terms of many different sorts that at least purport to refer to many different sorts of things, for example, artifacts, lumps of matter, spatial or temporal parts of objects, events, and so on. For those attempting to ground the reference of a new singular term, it will be radically indeterminate what the term refers to (or even whether or not it refers) unless they have some very basic concept of what sort of thing (broadly speaking) they intend to refer to, if the reference grounding is to succeed … . [T]he same qua problem clearly arises for any attempts at referring to individuals … -- and arises similarly for general terms … . To successfully disambiguate whether or not the reference of a term is grounded, and if so to what, it seems that nominative terms must be associated with a sortal or, more generally, categorial concept that does at least two things. First, it must establish certain very basic conditions under which the attempted grounding would or would not be successful in establishing reference. So, for instance, if I attempt to ground the name 'Orky' as the name of an animal (swimming near my boat), my attempt to ground the reference may fail if all that has perturbed the water near my boat is a large clump of seaweed … . Call these 'frame-level application conditions' for the term -- 'frame-level' since they involve conditions that are conceptually relevant to whether or not reference is established … . Some associated conceptual content is also needed to supply frame-level co-application conditions for our nominative terms -- that is, rules that (supposing the term to have been successfully applied) specify under what conditions the term would be applied again to one and the same entity … . Thus, for example, … the conditions under which the term 'book' (in the sense of a physical copy) may be correctly applied are the same as the conditions under which the term 'book' (in the sense of a literary work) may be applied. But the conditions under which we may refer again to one and the same copy versus to one and the same work are quite distinct. (pp. 38-40)

Now consider these remarks about existence questions:

[T]here are two steps to answering well-formed existence questions: first, there is the task of undertaking a kind of conceptual analysis, determining what category of entity is presupposed in standard uses of the term, and so what it would take (according to the frame-level application conditions for that categorial term) for there to be entities of the relevant kind, be they artifacts, fictional characters, numbers, or persons. Second, there is the empirical task of discovering whether or not these conditions are in fact fulfilled. As long as the existence claim adverts to a range of prior uses of the term as purporting to refer to something of a given category, the existence claim is truth-evaluable in this way … . Similarly, to be truth-evaluable, counting claims presuppose a category or categories of entities to be counted. (p. 111)

The regress worry arises when we consider existence questions and counting questions deploying the presupposed category itself -- questions as to whether or not something exists (perhaps in some specified location) that falls under the category, and/or how many such things there are. These questions seem meaningful and well-formed too, but on her own story their well-formedness requires treating them as presupposing some yet more general category of entity -- and so on, seemingly ad infinitum. (Note that in the first of the two passages just quoted, she claims that the qua problem arises for general terms, not just for singular terms.) Another way to put the worry is this: if every singular or general term of our language that successfully refers is governed by frame-level application and co-application conditions that deploy some presupposed category or categories, then terms referring to those very categories must themselves be governed by frame-level application and co-application conditions that deploy some further, yet more general, presupposed category or categories -- and so on, ad infinitum. But such an infinite regress of categories, with each category governed by frame-level application and co-application conditions involving yet more general categories, would seem to leave all the terms in our language without reference-grounding (much as an infinite regress of conditionally justified beliefs would seem to leave all the beliefs in the hierarchy without unconditional justification).

There is another, related, worry about the idea that well-formed existence questions deploying some singular or general term always are restricted by some category of entity presupposed by standard uses of the term -- viz., that it is just not plausible that human discourse and thought actually possess and employ an infinity of successively more general sortal categories. (I confess that this concern, together with the regress problem, make me wonder whether I am interpreting her correctly. But if she does not intend to claim that any meaningful existence claim involves implicit restriction of the quantifier by some sortal that is more general than any predicate deployed in the claim itself, then I do not understand on what basis she maintains that there are no meaningful existence questions that involve unrestricted quantification and deploy words like 'thing' and 'object' in an entirely neutral way.)

The natural-looking way out of these problems, while still allowing that many terms and concepts are indeed reference-grounded by frame-level application and co-application conditions involving more general categories, is to hold that not all terms and concepts get their reference grounded this way. More specifically, a natural two-part suggestion here is that (i) terms like 'thing' and 'object' have a perfectly general and generic use not associated with any particular category, and (ii) some existence claims employ fully unrestricted quantification, with all operative categories being explicitly expressed via general terms within the existence claim rather than implicitly restricting the quantifier itself. Many readers, myself included, are apt to think that this is the right tack to take.

On the other hand, doing so would require backing away from much that is central to her own view of metaphysics -- and would also threaten to undermine substantial portions of her defense of ordinary objects. For instance, her favored reply to argument (2), as summarized above, would no longer be available. Similarly, it is doubtful that she could plausibly defend her claim that ontological vagueness is "anodyne" and is explainable as derivative from the vagueness of representations.

But even for those who (like me) find her blanket "sortalism" implausible and deeply problematic, and who (like me) maintain that the right ontology will be one that eschews ordinary objects, there is much that is still plausible and attractive in her view of metaphysical methodology and of the truth-status of claims about ordinary objects. A way to re-cast her discussion would be to argue (i) that the kind of correspondence to the world that constitutes truth varies from one context of usage to another, (ii) that in some contexts (e.g., contexts of serious ontological inquiry) the pertinent form of correspondence is a direct kind in which the referential apparatus of one's statements carries ontological commitments, but (iii) that in numerous contexts of everyday discourse and even scientific discourse, the pertinent kind of correspondence is an indirect kind in which the referential apparatus of one's statements does not carry ontological commitment to items directly answering to one's singular and general terms or one's unnegated existential quantifications. From the perspective of someone who (like me) finds this alternative kind of framework attractive, the real value of Thomasson's book is the illumination it throws upon the workings of ordinary-object discourse, and on the ways that numerous claims employing such discourse are true without incurring genuine ontological commitment to ordinary objects at all. An important part of metaphysics is to provide such illumination -- a meta-metaphysical claim that can be cheerfully embraced even by those (like me) who hold that another fundamental role for metaphysical inquiry is precisely to seek out (always with an eye on science) deep discoveries about what really exists.