Orientation and Judgment in Hermeneutics

Placeholder book cover

Rudolf A. Makkreel, Orientation and Judgment in Hermeneutics, University of Chicago Press, 2015, 244pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226249315.

Reviewed by Jeff Malpas, University of Tasmania


Although occasionally taken up in the past by thinkers such as Richard Rorty or Alasdair MacIntyre, hermeneutics has generally been a neglected topic among most English-language philosophers. All too often, hermeneutics has been seen in the Anglo-American world as a rather arcane topic belonging more to theology, rhetoric, literature, or even historiography, than to philosophy proper. When it has been taken up in an explicit fashion in philosophical circles, it has frequently been in connection with specifically theological, rhetorical, literary or historiographical concerns, perhaps as part of the history of philosophy (especially German philosophy), or else as belonging essentially to phenomenology (and barely distinguishable from it). Yet elsewhere, across much of Europe for example, hermeneutics constitutes a significant, and sometimes even the dominant, mode of philosophising, and in the work of thinkers such as Gadamer, Ricoeur, and Vattimo, hermeneutics and philosophy are inextricably intertwined. There are some indications, however, that hermeneutics is gaining greater recognition in English-language philosophy, and if so, then Rudolf A. Makkreel's book is likely to be one of the works that will further contribute to this. Makkreel is already well-known as one of the leading scholars of the history of hermeneutics, but in addition he has always been an original thinker of hermeneutics as such. This book draws together Makkreel's own hermeneutical thinking as developed over many years, and does so in a way that provides both a unified vision of hermeneutics in its philosophical context and of hermeneutics in its historical development.

At the heart of Makkreel's account is a sustained re-thinking of hermeneutics from an essentially Kantian perspective that draws heavily on the Kantian account of judgment as developed in the third Critique as well as other works. Although Kant's influence is clearly evident in the work of almost all the key thinkers who figure within the hermeneutic tradition from the late eighteenth century onwards, including Heidegger and Gadamer, Kant seldom has prominence in discussions of hermeneutics or its history. Whether or not one agrees with the details of Makkreel's account, he does an important service in re-focussing attention on Kant's relevance to hermeneutics, and in this respect, he provides an important reconfiguration of the history of hermeneutics. Moreover, in repositioning hermeneutics in relation to Kant, so too does Makkreel reinforce the Kantian background to Dilthey's thinking. In many ways, the book is, perhaps not surprisingly given Makkreel's own longstanding Diltheyan interests, itself a reassertion of the philosophical character and significance of Dilthey's contribution to hermeneutics as against the focus that is so often given to Heidegger and Gadamer. Significantly, the first chapter, 'Philosophical Hermeneutics: Reassessing the Tradition in Relation to Dilthey and Heidegger' offers an integrative reading that draws together Dilthey and Heidegger, showing the degree to which Dilthey can be seen as already anticipating some of Heidegger's thinking in Sein und Zeit.

The book has three parts and nine chapters. Part I, 'The Hermeneutic Situation', encompasses the first two chapters, and is partly polemical in character, taking issue with some standard hermeneutical positions, but also has a more positive aspect in terms of the re-reading it offers of both Dilthey and Heidegger. Part II, 'Interpretive Contexts, Judgment, and Critique', forms the main body of the volume, and it is in the five chapters that appear here that Makkreel engages directly with Kant in the process of setting out his positive account of hermeneutics. Here Makkreel considers the structure of judgment, and the interplay between different elements of judgment, particularly in relation to the contexts of judgment, as well as the nature of reflection and critique, along with questions of meaning, truth, normativity, legitimation and validity. The final two chapters, which together make up Part III, 'Adaptations and Applications', deal with contemporary issues in the philosophy of history and the arts. In particular, Makkreel discusses problems of narrativity in history, both in relation to questions of historical objectivity and historical causality, as well as addressing the issue of contextualisation in artistic understanding. In the latter case, Makkreel advances an account that emphasises what he terms the 'medial contexts' of artistic works, directing attention both to the medium of the work as that in which the work is materialized, but also as that which implies a particular mode of interpretive orientation.

The argument Makkreel develops is largely driven by the need to respond to a particular condition of modernity, namely, the seeming loss of a single unitary tradition that could provide the context for interpretation or that could underpin the possibility of dialogue as the basis for understanding. As Makkreel writes:

A dialogue or conversation is an idealised mode of communication that may make sense within one continuous tradition, but unfortunately our world today is more complex than that. The world involves the intersection of various traditions for which the ideas of fusion and concurrence appear remote and inapplicable. Today, more than ever, we are confronted with a global situation in which different heritages stand in such conflict that no dialogue seems possible (p.52).

It is the absence of a prior communal framework that, as Makkreel presents matters, forces individual judgment to the fore. Since our current situation is also akin to the situation we find ourselves in with respect to aesthetic judgment, in which we are look to establish universality on the basis only of the particular, and so without access to any prior universality or unity, so it might also seem to be a situation well-suited to being addressed from within the framework offered by Kant. Here judgment is understood in relation to the explicit activity of judging, as a form of rational assessment, and as distinct from any implicit 'pre-judgments', 'prejudices' or 'pre-understandings' (although Makkreel also argues that some pre-judgments can themselves, through reflection, be taken up into the sphere of judgment proper). It is precisely the need to re-focus on judgment in this sense that underpins Makkreel's turn to Kant, as well as to Dilthey, in the elaboration of a properly critical hermeneutics. However, the judgment at issue must be, as Makkreel presents matters, both diagnostic and reflective. Orientation, which here means the capacity to adopt a critical perspective in relation to the context of judgment, and so effectively to position judgment in its diagnostic role (Makkreel draws heavily on the analogy of judgmental and spatial orientation), thus becomes an essential element of hermeneutic practice. Inasmuch as pre-judgment or 'prejudice' is seen as part of the context of judgment, then Makkreel's position is one that explicitly champions judgment over pre-judgment -- and, in doing so, also gives priority to individual judgment over collective tradition.

It is the prioritization of judgment over pre-judgment that Makkreel takes to separate his account of hermeneutics from that of Heidegger and Gadamer, -- "both Heidegger and Gadamer", he says, "devalue the role of judgment in hermeneutics in favour of pre-understanding and prejudices" (p.93).[1] Yet it is against Gadamer that Makkreel more consistently and directly sets himself, arguing against Gadamer's dialogic conception of hermeneutics as well as against the Gadamerian emphasis on tradition. Similarly, Makkreel's own sympathetic reading of Kant itself marks a significant point of contrast with Gadamer (at least the Gadamer of Wahrheit und Methode) since Gadamer's position partly arises out of a rejection of what he takes to be the subjectivism associated with Kantian aesthetics (thus Makkreel also engages in a reappraisal of Kant's emphasis on 'feeling' -- an emphasis that is otherwise often taken to be indicative of Kant's subjectivism).

Makkreel is, of course, not the first to take issue with Gadamer's account of hermeneutics and the role it gives to tradition or to 'prejudice'. Indeed, one way of viewing Makkreel's project -- one that coheres both with the emphasis on Kant as well as on the interpretive complexity of the modern situation -- is that it offers a reconceptualization of hermeneutics that is in many ways convergent with critical theory, especially as developed by Habermas. Part of what makes Makkreel's position distinctive, however, is the way in which it is undertaken from within hermeneutics itself and in terms that are drawn directly from the hermeneutic tradition. What Makkreel offers is a rethinking of hermeneutics in Kantian terms that also rehabilitates what might be viewed as an essentially Diltheyan view of hermeneutics, and in so doing reintroduces as properly hermeneutic concerns questions of cognitive grounding and legitimation, of epistemic validity and critique, and of the differentiation of judgments and their referential domains.

Makkreel sets out an alternative conception of hermeneutics in its contemporary relevance, but he also takes issue with idea, commonplace in readings of the history of hermeneutics, that it is only with Heidegger and Gadamer that hermeneutics becomes philosophical. Makkreel's reorientation of hermeneutics in explicit relation to a Kantian account of judgment thus involves a rethought conception of hermeneutics as well as a rethinking of the history of hermeneutics according to which hermeneutics is philosophically engaged from the very beginning -- and thereby giving a renewed recognition to the genuinely philosophical character of the work of a thinker such Dilthey. As Makkreel argues, it is not that hermeneutics prior to Heidegger was merely a discipline that aimed to address certain domain-specific problems of interpretive methodology, but rather that it always concerned questions of interpretation and judgment that are themselves fundamental to philosophical thinking as they are to all thinking. In this respect, Makkreel is at one with Gadamer (and apart from Habermas), in asserting the universality of hermeneutics, though on somewhat different grounds.

There is much of interest throughout Makkreel's presentation both for those familiar with the issues at stake and also for those new to the field. Although clearly not intended as an introductory text, the first two chapters of the book nevertheless provide an interesting overview, albeit from a particular perspective, of a set of key hermeneutical concepts and issues. The final two chapters also make a contribution to contemporary debates concerning historical objectivity and aesthetic understanding. The most weighty contributions in the book, however, are undoubtedly those that figure in the middle chapters in which Makkreel sets out the core of his account, and these chapters are significant, not only for the way they contribute to Makkreel's account of hermeneutics, but also for the way they engage with the reading of Kant. Makkreel's book is, in this respect, as much a defence of the continuing significance of Kant's account of judgment (and so also of Kant's account of aesthetic judgment), and so a contribution to contemporary Kant scholarship, as it is an argument for a revised conception of hermeneutics. Consistent with the emphasis on 'orientation' in his title, Makkreel's reading of Kant gives prominence to a set of topological themes and concepts (see esp. pp.63-80) -- including the notions of Schranke andGrenze,[2] but also, among others, AufenthaltGebiet, and Boden -- that are all too often neglected or overlooked. Makkreel's brief discussion of Josiah Royce's work is also noteworthy, even though Makkreel presents it largely as a preliminary to his more sustained engagement with Kant, since it is suggestive of important points of convergence between elements of hermeneutic thinking and strands within the American idealist-pragmatist tradition -- strands that connect Royce to C. I. Lewis and G. H. Mead, and thence also to W.V. Quine and Donald Davidson.

Makkreel's book bears comparison with Günter Figal's GegenständlichkeitDas Hermeneutische und die Philosophie (published in German in 2006, and in English translation in 2010). Both volumes offer distinctive accounts of hermeneutics and of the philosophical significance of hermeneutics, and both take issue with hermeneutics in its Heideggerian and especially its Gadamerian instantiations. Both Makkreel and Figal also identify aspects of the Gadamerian account that they see as limiting the genuinely critical potential of hermeneutic thinking. In Figal's case this is focused around what is taken to be the lack of positive attention to the role of distance in interpretation and understanding (distance being closely tied to Gegenständlichkeit or 'objectivity'), and one might argue that this itself a closely related issue to that which Makkreel takes up in terms of orientation (in both cases, one might argue, there is an important spatial or topological dimension to the accounts that are developed -- in their critical as well as their positive aspects). Figal, however, devotes much more direct critical attention to Gadamer than does Makkreel (as well as engaging more closely with the tradition of twentieth-century hermeneutics, particularly through Ricoeur), but without the same focus on the earlier history of hermeneutics (neither Kant nor Dilthey figure so significantly in Figal), and certainly without the same emphasis on the Kantian conception of judgment. Although in some ways convergent, the two works thus follow very different courses in their approach to hermeneutics -- Makkreel might point out that Figal's account remains more firmly within the Heideggerian tradition than his own -- and there can be no easy preference for one over the other. Nevertheless, the appearance of both these works in close succession, each offering a similarly expansive account of hermeneutics in its philosophical context, is itself an indication of an increasing critical focus on hermeneutics as such.

There can be no doubt that Makkreel's work, like Figal's, represents a significant contribution to contemporary hermeneutic thought. This is so even though one might well take issue with key aspects of Makkreel's account, as one might with Figal's also. Makkreel's focus on judgment is an obvious point of contention here, especially since Makkreel devotes very little attention to the considerations that ground the Heideggerian and Gadamerian prioritization of the 'pre-judgmental'. Indeed, one might argue that, although he gives it some acknowledgement, Makkreel is insufficiently attentive to the very different orientation that underpins the Heideggerian-Gadamerian approach compared to his own. The difference at issue here is quite fundamental: on the one hand interpretation appears as an activity of the interpreter, and as proceeding via a process of individual judgment or assessment; on the other hand, interpretation is seen as an event that is prior to any individual judging, and to which the interpreter is already given over. One might add, that what is actually at issue in the Heideggerian-Gadamerian emphasis on the 'pre-judgmental' is itself something that arises out of the Kantian tradition itself: namely, a concern with the transcendental structure out of which judgment and understanding arise. Indeed, one might query the extent to which even Makkreel himself can completely avoid the reference back to some such 'pre-structure', even if, in Kant, it is a 'pre-structure' given in the structure of transcendental subjectivity. If nothing else, this indicates the need for a closer and more sustained engagement with the Heideggerian position (the later no less than the earlier), as well as the Gadamerian, than Makkreel actually provides. This is especially so in relation to Gadamer, where Makkreel's criticisms tend to be presented as if they were self-evident and without needing substantiation or elaboration, and where he also seems often to assume rather narrow construals of the key Gadamerian concepts with which he takes issue -- most notably of course, the notions of 'dialogue' and 'prejudice'.[3] Moreover, Makkreel also seems to overlook the Kantian elements that are present in Gadamer's own account, while also apparently ignoring the responses Gadamer has himself made to the sorts of criticisms (and the issues underlying them) advanced by Makkreel (most notably, perhaps in his responses to Habermas).

Although Makkreel is correct is asserting that hermeneutics does not become philosophical only with Heidegger, still one might also take issue with Makkreel's reading of the place Heidegger occupies within the history of hermeneutics. Heidegger's contribution is indeed a pivotal one, and it is so not because it gives rise to a conception of hermeneutics as philosophical, but because it involves a hermeneutical transformation in philosophy itself, and so also in the conception of ontology. This transformation brings with it a reorientation in hermeneutics, but that reorientation is towards a new conception of what the philosophical might involve rather than merely toward hermeneutics alone. Part of the difference here also reflects a difference in how we approach Kant: whether we read Kant, as Heidegger does, in the manner of Heidegger's 1927 Kantbuch, and so as focussed (to use terms congenial to Makkreel's account) on the prior structure in which judgment is founded, and so on the bounding conditions of judgment as they stand outside of the activity of judging, or whether we read Kant, in the way Makkreel does, as more narrowly focussed on the analysis of judgment as such (which also indicates the possibility that Kant can be read as standing in a foundational position in relation to the conception of hermeneutics found in Heidegger no less than in Makkreel). This, of course, returns us to some of the earlier debates around Kant, and also around hermeneutics, that were going on in the early part of the twentieth century, and that came to the fore in the Davos disputation between Heidegger and Ernst Cassirer in 1929.[4]

One final point: part of what is significant about Makkreel's approach (and also, as I noted above, about Figal's) is indeed the way it brings to the fore a set of 'topological' issues -- issues concerning place, situation, and orientation. However, it seems to me that as Makkreel approaches them, these issues still require further interrogation -- especially as they arise in their Kantian instantiations (it may be that too abstract or formal a focus on the problem of judgment is itself an obstacle to such an interrogation). I would argue that is precisely here that one is forced to move towards the sort of approach to be found in Heidegger since it is hard to see how the topological can be adequately addressed without attending to the character of topos itself, and topos is precisely that in which we already find ourselves (it is precisely what is at issue in Heidegger's early focus on facticity noted above -- I would take this even further and to say, though I cannot substantiate the claim here, that it is actually what is at issue in the very idea of the transcendental as such). In this respect, I am inclined to say that while Makkreel's Orientation and Judgment in Hermeneutics is indeed a valuable and significant work in its own right, providing an intriguing and innovative elaboration of hermeneutics from a Kantian-Diltheyan perspective, what is perhaps most interesting about it is precisely the topological direction that it opens up, but only partly begins to explore. Makkreel's work, like Figal's, thus provokes a set of further questions concerning, not only hermeneutics, but the very relation between hermeneuein and topos. Could it be, for instance, that hermeneutics is essentially topology -- and what would that mean?

[1] Sometimes Makkreel does seem to suggest a softening of his position in relation to the hermeneutics associated with Gadamer and Heidegger (and especially Heidegger), at one point characterising his own reflective-critical approach as one that mediates between a hermeneutics focussed on existential ontological analysis and a more methodologically inclined hermeneutics focussed on the Geisteswissenschaften -- see p.172.

[2] One oddity in Makkreel's discussion of the notions of Schranke and Grenze in Kant should be noted. Makkreel says of Grenze that it can be translated as 'boundary' or as 'bound', where 'bound' is associated with a 'binding constraint' (see p.63). But in English, the sense of 'bound' as associated with 'bind' is quite different from 'bound' as associated with 'boundary' (in fact there are two different etymologies here). In German, the matter is even clearer: while the sense of 'bound' associated with 'boundary' is given by Grenze, the sense associated with 'binding constraint' is surely given by Band. This may seem a small point, but it does connect with the central Heideggerian clam that Grenze shoud be understood, not in the sense of that which merely restricts or constrains, but as that which is productive or facilitating (a claim that appears in several places, but most famously in 'Bauen Wohnen Denken'). The Heideggerian emphasis on the 'pre-judgmental' over the 'judgmental' (to use the sort of construal that appears in Makkreel) is itself tied to this emphasis on the facilitating power of the boundary in relation to that which appears within it.

[3] One might argue that while Makkreel rejects the Gadamerian emphasis on dialogue, his own account nevertheless draws (as one might argue it must) upon notions of negotiation, mediation, and responsiveness that can themselves be seen as dialogical (or 'conversational') in character. I am not sure how Makkreel would respond to such a line of argument, but it does indicate the way in which a larger set of issues remain in the background here -- it also suggests that there may be room for some rapprochement between the Kantian account Makkreel advances and the Gadamerian account he rejects.

[4] The reoriented conception of philosophy and hermeneutics that Heidegger initiates, and that Gadamer continues, is not only one that rethinks ontology as hermeneutics and hermeneutics as ontology (which is what underpins Heidegger's 1923 lectures on the hermeneutics of facticity), but is partly at work in the shift in hermeneutical focus from 'meaning' to 'truth' that is evident in Heidegger after Sein und Zeit as well as in Gadamer (a shift that can be seen as also occurring within an analytic framework in the work of Davidson). I would argue that truth is a less opaque notion than is meaning, and that the tendency to assume a notion of meaning as central to hermeneutical discourse (evident in Makkreel's discussion as it is elsewhere) is itself problematic.