Origins of Moral-Political Philosophy in Early China: Contestation of Humaneness, Justice, and Personal Freedom

Chinese Political Philo

Tao Jiang, Origins of Moral-Political Philosophy in Early China: Contestation of Humaneness, Justice, and Personal Freedom, Oxford University Press, 2021, 536pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780197611364.

Reviewed by Eric L. Hutton, University of Utah


Tao Jiang’s book presents an ambitious and sweeping survey of early Chinese thought that is in some ways a successor—but also a rival—to a handful of other classic English-language studies likewise offering ambitious and sweeping treatments of the subject, such as Benjamin Schwartz’s The World of Thought in Ancient China (Belknap Press, 1985) and Angus Graham’s Disputers of the Tao (Open Court, 1989). An especially noteworthy feature of Jiang’s book is that it takes account of much recent research on the Chinese materials, including discussion of methodological controversies and texts recovered in archaeological finds. The volume can thus serve not only as an introduction for beginners to early Chinese thought, but also as an introduction to contemporary scholars’ views and debates. By itself, that feature of the book makes it a valuable contribution to the literature and a worthy successor to those earlier overviews.

The way that Jiang’s book aims to rival its predecessors rests in the specific narrative offered. Per the book’s subtitle, Jiang proposes understanding the early Chinese texts largely in terms of an unfolding debate about “humaneness” and “justice.” These labels are deliberately not intended as equivalents for any particular Chinese terms, but rather represent “broad underlying values” identifiable in the texts (35). As Jiang explains them, “humaneness” is “the moral norm that is agent/recipient relative, namely our natural inclination to be partial toward those who are close to us, especially our family/kin members” (36), while “justice” is “the moral norm that is agent/recipient neutral, namely our exercise of impartial judgment on the merits of persons and states of affairs, [. . .] irrespective of their relations to us” (36). According to Jiang (chapter 1), humaneness and justice were originally integrated (imperfectly) in the thought of Confucius as presented in the Analects. However, they came to be recognized as competing commitments in most other early texts, with the Mengzi favoring mostly humaneness (chapter 2), while the majority of other early texts—including the Mozi (also chapter 2), Laozi (chapter 3), Xunzi (chapter 6), and earlier fajia writings and later the Han Feizi (chapters 4 and 7, respectively)—prioritize justice, though the preferred conception of justice still differs markedly between them. Significantly, on Jiang’s telling (chapter 5), the Zhuangzi emerges as an “outlier” in this narrative, because it “reject[s] the very parameter of humaneness versus justice in the mainstream discourse” (37) and instead mainly advocates for “personal freedom,” namely an “appreciation and cultivation of personal space [. . .] without being entangled in the sociopolitical world” (36), which Jiang later characterizes more specifically as akin to Isaiah Berlin’s notion of “negative freedom” (468). 

This account is definitely an original approach to the relations between these various texts, and Jiang makes various novel claims about each of them along the way. The success of Jiang’s project thus depends heavily on the persuasiveness of this narrative and his interpretations of the individual texts. In a book as big as Jiang’s, scholars may easily find many points where they disagree or remain unpersuaded, and I myself disagree with quite a few of Jiang’s claims, so I am not fully convinced by the narrative he offers. Nevertheless, I do think that Jiang succeeds in identifying an important set of issues under debate that can be helpful—especially for newcomers to Chinese philosophy—in approaching the texts, even if I think the story should be told differently in several places.

In particular, one interesting implication of Jiang’s narrative is that early Chinese moral-political philosophy turns out to focus mostly on competing visions of justice. There is something potentially salutary about that perspective, especially as against some who might incline toward believing that the early Chinese had no conception of, or interest in, justice. Jiang’s perspective also renders the early Chinese tradition more comparable to the Western tradition, in which philosophers have been contending over justice since at least Plato, and there are potentially beneficial aspects to that implication as well. At minimum, such similarity makes approaching the Chinese tradition easier for those with no prior exposure to it. More positively, it may suggest new avenues for exploring overlaps between Chinese and Western texts that might otherwise seem to lack any shared interests.

However, as mentioned earlier, I also have reservations about several parts of the book, and I worry that the framing in terms of humaneness versus justice versus personal freedom may obscure other important points debated by the texts. Constraints of space preclude any extensive recounting of my concerns here, and so I will instead focus on just one element of the early Chinese intellectual landscape that Jiang’s discussion omits. In doing so, I wish both to indicate to those unfamiliar with the Chinese tradition an important limitation of Jiang’s survey, and also to highlight a problem for his narrative, especially regarding the Zhuangzi. Now, Jiang begins his book by explaining that it originated as a project on just the Zhuangzi, but in order to articulate the significance of that text’s ideas, he felt compelled to frame them against a broader background of early Chinese thought, and hence the book became a wide-ranging study (xiii). Since Jiang’s initial aim was not to write an exhaustive survey of the early period, but rather to make sense of the distinctive position(s) in the Zhuangzi, it is unsurprising that some texts and thinkers receive little or no attention. Even so, it is noteworthy that Jiang does not devote any substantial discussion to one group of thinkers who seem undeniably to have exerted considerable influence on at least parts of the Zhuangzi, namely the so-called mingjia 名家 (or “Sophists,” as the term is sometimes translated) such as Hui Shi and Gongsun Long. The paradoxical theses attributed to these thinkers are repeatedly referenced in the Zhuangzi and seem to provide support for some stances that the text promotes, such as skepticism about the adequacy of language.

There can be understandable reasons for passing over the mingjia. As a practical matter, publishers have length limits. More academically, evidence concerning the mingjia is largely fragmentary, second-hand, and/or from much later times, and their theses—such as the infamous one attributed to Gongsun Long that “A white horse is not a horse” (as it is often translated)—have little direct connection to the moral-political debates that are Jiang’s primary concern. Nevertheless, omitting discussion of how the mingjia influenced the Zhuangzi risks making that text seem more detached from the surrounding conversations in early China than it really is, and moreover—as I shall propose below—risks overlooking ways in which the Zhuangzi may have been more involved in the “mainstream” moral-political debate over humaneness versus justice than Jiang seems to allow.

For one thing, although many of the theses proposed by the mingjia have no immediately apparent moral-political content, there is at least one interesting exception. Namely, chapter 33 of the Zhuangzi itself lists the following among Hui Shi’s theses: “Let love embrace the ten thousand things; Heaven and Earth are a single body” (fan ai wan wu, tian di yi ti ye 氾愛萬物,天地一體也, trans. Watson 2013: 297). That chapter merely reports this view, but elsewhere the Zhuangzi echoes the first half of this thesis in a passage that does seem to be endorsing it. Namely, in chapter 17—from which Jiang repeatedly draws in constructing his interpretation of the Zhuangzi—one character who seems to represent the preferred view in the text advises another character thus:

Be stern like the ruler of a state—he grants no private favor. Be benign and impartial like the god of the soil at the sacrifice—he grants no private blessing. Be broad and expansive like the endlessness of the four directions—they have nothing that bounds or hedges them. Embrace the ten thousand things universally—how could there be one you should give special support to? (jian huai wan wu, qi shu cheng yi 兼懷萬物,其孰承翼, trans. Watson 2013: 132)

Now, Jiang takes the Mohist doctrine of jian ai 兼愛, which he translates as “impartial caring,” as the first significant view prioritizing justice over humaneness, and since this passage’s advice resembles the Mohist notion of an inclusive care that does not favor one party over another on the basis of some special relation, it would seem to match squarely Jiang’s model of what counts as justice, but simply expanded beyond the human realm to all things. Moreover, since the passage may have been inspired by something like Hui Shi’s thesis, it shows that the Zhuangzi could have followed other routes to arrive at ideas very similar to Mohism while nonetheless repudiating it in most other respects. Another important point to note is that in context this advice is directed to a river god, whose title (he bo 河伯) has a distinctively political flavor, since bo was often used for a feudal rank, frequently translated into English as “earl,” and Burton Watson, for example, renders the title as “Lord of the River.” Insofar as a powerful entity supervising a particular domain (namely, the Yellow River, one of the most powerful forces in Chinese geography), is being given such advice, the text would seem after all to be promoting the prioritization in the realm of politics of what Jiang labels considerations of justice, albeit in a less-than-straightforward manner.

This last point leads to another observation about the relevance of the mingjia, which is that various early sources (including the Zhuangzi itself) depict them as having worked for, or at, the courts of rulers. It is somewhat unclear what their purpose was in presenting their paradoxical theses at the courts, if that is what they were indeed doing, but their activities were certainly taken as politically significant by at least some of their (near) contemporaries. In particular, the Xunzi repeatedly criticizes Hui Shi and others of his ilk for having a deleterious influence on government and society, and chapter 22 of the Xunzi teaches that even language not overtly political in character can nonetheless be politically impactful. If the mingjia had the ear of rulers and high officials, then even if the mingjia had no overt political agendas—and perhaps even if they had no covert political agendas, either—their activities, paradoxical theses, and their disruption of ordinary ways of talking and thinking could have affected politics. As noted earlier, the Zhuangzi sometimes borrows from the paradoxes of the mingjia, and hence we should recognize the possibility that, like the mingjia, pieces of the Zhuangzi ostensibly unrelated to anything political might nevertheless have been, in their own time, contributing to political debates without presenting themselves as such.

Consider, for example, the following passage from chapter 6 about Master Yu going to visit his friend, Master Sang:

When he got to Master Sang’s gate, he heard something like singing or crying and someone striking a lute and saying:





It was as though the voice would not hold out and the singer were rushing to get through the words.

Master Yu went inside and said, “What do you mean—singing a song like that!”

“I was pondering what it is that has brought me to this extremity, but I couldn’t find the answer. My father and mother surely wouldn’t wish this poverty on me. Heaven covers all without partiality; earth bears up all without partiality—heaven and earth surely wouldn’t single me out to make me poor. I try to discover who is doing it, but I can’t get the answer. Still, here I am—at the very extreme. It must be due to what is decreed (ming 命).” (translation modified from Watson 2013: 53–54)

Here, Master Sang proposes four possible causes of his poverty. He then clearly rules out his parents and Heaven (and Earth), but does not so clearly rule out other human beings, beyond saying that he cannot identify anyone who is keeping him poor. He concludes that his poverty must be due to “what is decreed”—but decreed by whom? Most readers take the “decree” in question to be a kind of cosmic decree, namely “fate.” However, the passage’s wording is ambiguous and could mean that it is the ruler’s decrees, even if not the ruler personally, causing his undeserved poverty. Should the remark be read that way? That is hard to say, and that may be precisely the intention behind the ambiguity: a ruler reading the story might not see the implied criticism at all, but if he did, the story is just vague enough to give its author a plausible way to deny that any such criticism was meant, yet the potential complaint would already have been brought to the ruler’s mind.

To reframe this idea somewhat more generally, in claiming that the Zhuangzi advocates for “personal freedom,” Jiang repeatedly cites an example from chapter 17 of the text where the character Zhuangzi is depicted as turning down an overture from a king to serve in his government. However, refusing to serve the government is not the same as refusing to advise it, and in fact numerous other stories in the text depict Zhuangzi and others doing precisely the latter. In passages such as those I have discussed, the Zhuangzi may well be offering advice to rulers without appearing to do so, and it may likewise in various ways be endorsing justice without straightforwardly appearing to do so—and it would be consistent with much else in the Zhuangzi for it to be attempting to convince those with power while not offering any clear persuasion and to be promoting certain values without openly advocating for them.

Jiang does not consider such a possibility, and so far my remarks are just a sketch that would require further development to become a fully viable interpretation of the text, but I do think that considerable room remains for potentially seeing the Zhuangzi as very much engaged in the “mainstream” moral-political debates of the early period like other texts and perhaps taking the same side as some of them, though in a quite different manner. That is not to say that Jiang’s claim that the Zhuangzi promotes a version of personal freedom is incorrect, but rather to suggest that the case for seeing the Zhuangzi as largely opting out of the debate over justice versus humaneness in favor of primarily promoting personal freedom has not been as solidly established as Jiang hopes.

For reasons such as the preceding (and others that I lack space to discuss here), I find Jiang’s narrative not fully persuasive on certain major claims he wants to press. In conclusion, then—and to return to the comparison from which I started—I would not say that Jiang’s work supersedes the classic overviews by Schwartz and Graham, though I do think it can usefully complement them.


Watson, B., tr. (2013). The Complete Works of Zhuangzi. New York: Columbia University Press.