Origins of Objectivity

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Tyler Burge, Origins of Objectivity, Oxford University Press, 2010, 624pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199581399.

Reviewed by Endre Begby, Centre for the Study of Mind in Nature (CSMN), University of Oslo


Origins of Objectivity is Tyler Burge's long-awaited first monograph. It is an absolutely terrific work, conceived and executed at a scale and level of ambition rarely seen in contemporary philosophy. The book's primary aim is to contribute a theory of perception; more broadly, however, it also delivers a subtle and nuanced query into the place of distinctively psychological capacities in the natural order. One can only hope that the book will come to shape discussions in the philosophy of mind and perception for years to come, not just in terms of its specific doctrines -- bold and persuasive as they are -- but also in terms of its methods. Burge's integration of insights from a vast range of empirical sciences with philosophical reflection stands out as a model for emulation.

The book is organized into three parts. A first part (roughly 105 pp.) contains terminological clarifications and introductory material connecting the present inquiry with Burge's broader philosophical program of anti-individualism. The second part (roughly 180 pp.) contains detailed and systematic criticisms of previous philosophical attempts to grapple with the problems of perception and singular reference. Although the net is cast widely (to include Husserl and Heidegger, for instance), the main focus is on the quartet of Strawson, Evans, Quine, and Davidson. Finally, the third part (roughly 260 pp.) contains the bulk of the work's scientific explorations, which help give substance and direction to Burge's own positive account of perception. At 550 pages of densely argued body text, the book is by no means easily approachable. However, its main critical and constructive lines of argument are easier to extract than one might fear at first. As in much of Burge's work, the devil is in the details.

I will start by outlining Burge's positive account of perception, before turning to his criticisms of previous philosophical attempts. I will end by detailing two objections one might have to Burge's account. One is that his arguments are too strongly centered on vision, thereby losing track of important distinctive features of the workings of other sensory modalities. The other objection starts from the insight, crucial to the tradition Burge is criticizing, that human empirical cognition is marked by a fluid interface between conceptual and perceptual capacities. This is an insight which Burge should be able to make room for, but which is made difficult by his insistence that we account for perception in neatly modular terms.

1. Burge's positive account

Burge's primary concern is to understand the nature of perception and, in particular, to understand the distinction between perception and "mere" sensory registration of information. Burge describes perception as "a sensory capacity for objectified representation" (317), and throughout the book, terms such as "perception," "perceptual representation," and "perceptual objectification" are used more or less interchangeably.

On the one hand, Burge argues that we should look to modes of explanation in current empirical science to learn what perception is and how it differs from sensation. On the other hand, he advocates a robust metaphysical realism about the distinction and explicitly denounces any more pragmatically inclined account.[1] Thus, perception is a distinctive natural kind discovered in recent perceptual psychology (9). While the discovery derives from empirical studies, the status of the distinction between sensation and perception is not merely provisional or dependent on a particular body of scientific theory. Rather, it marks a "cut in nature" (xii). Burge writes:

Described from the point of view of anatomy and physiology, there is a continuum between an amoeba's sensitivity to light and human vision. Described from the point of view of explanations of the visual systems in mammals and other relatively complex animals, perceptual representation is a distinctive kind of psychological state. (319)

Any theory -- scientific or philosophical -- that fails to heed, or otherwise mischaracterizes, the distinction between sensation and perception gets the nature or essence of the relevant capacities wrong, regardless of what explanatory power it can claim in other regards.

Perception, according to Burge, is not propositional and is constitutively independent of conceptual capacities. Nonetheless, perceptual states do possess significant internal structure, a structure which is in many ways strikingly analogous to that which can be recovered from propositional forms. A perceptual state consists of a singular element, which "functions fallibly to single out (refer to) perceived particulars," and a general (or attributive) element, which "functions fallibly to group or categorize particulars by attributing some indicated kind, property, or relation to them" (83). In other words, perception serves not only to single out particular objects but to represent these objects as bearing particular properties or as falling under kinds. Even so, perceptual attributives are not concepts: it is constitutive of concepts that they can be employed in context-free "pure attributions" (e.g., cats are mammals). Perceptual attributives, by contrast, must remain context-bound (cf. 540ff).

There is an intimate relation between perception and causation: while causation is not itself a representational relation, many representational relations -- specifically, perceptual reference -- constitutively depend on causal relations (62). The causal relations that ground perceptual states also provide them with veridicality conditions (roughly, non-propositional analogs of truth-conditions). Perception is constitutively of concrete particulars; moreover, it is a "constitutive condition on accurate perception … that it be caused by what it is a perception of" (5).

That perceptual states possess veridicality conditions is key to understanding how they differ from mere sensations. Representational content and veridicality conditions are complementary notions. To demarcate perception from sensation, we need to look to modes of scientific explanation that make ineliminable appeal to states bearing veridicality conditions as distinct from modes of explanation where such appeals would be "dispensable, redundant, and misleading" (9).

In mere sensation, there is no room for a distinction between veridicality and error. We can contrive, if we will, to ascribe veridicality conditions also to non-perceptual sensory states (like philosophers have contrived to attribute representational states to thermostats or plants), but such veridicality conditions will be "trivial" and play no part in the explanation of the relevant states (cf. 292ff): "invoking them gains no empirical traction, yields no empirical illumination" (395).

Roughly speaking, then, the distinction between sensation and perception is the distinction between sensory states of an organism that can be explained wholly or largely in terms of surface irritations[2] and sensory states of an organism that can only be explained by invoking representational content with conditions of veridicality. So far, this is familiar stuff. Burge's striking proposal is that the transition from sensation to perception can be accounted for in terms of perceptual constancies; i.e., "capacities systematically to represent a given particular or attribute as the same despite significant variations in proximal stimulation" (274). Well-studied instances of perceptual constancies are constancies of color (ability to perceive an object as retaining a particular color despite variation in illumination), shape (ability to perceive an object as having a particular shape whether it is seen straight on or from an angle), and size (ability to perceive an object as being of a particular size whether it is seen from up close or from a distance).

The defining task of perception, Burge explains, is to overcome the underdetermination problem. Burge describes the problem in terms of visual perception:

The information available in registrations of patterns and spectral properties of the light striking the retina -- and the registrations of such light arrays -- significantly underdetermine the distal causes of those registrations, hence the objects and properties that are represented in perception, hence representational content as of those objects and properties. The same firings of retinal sensors are compatible with numerous possible (even physically possible) causes. (90)

A key part of visual perception consists in transitioning from sensory information registration in 2D to 3D representational content. This is what gives rise to familiar visual illusions such as the Ames room.

Burge's thesis (92-93) is that in order to understand the nature of perception, we must take into account the tradition in scientific psychology that started with Helmholtz (1857-67) and came to fruition following the work of David Marr (1982). The guiding idea behind this research paradigm is "to explain a series of unconscious, largely automatic transformational processes that lead from registration of the array and spectral properties of light striking the retina to the formation of perceptions as of specific aspects of the distal environment" (92). Perception, we saw, is constitutively of concrete particulars. These law-like computational processes, operating at subindividual levels, provide the key to understanding how the vast range of possible causes of a sensory state is pruned down to yield a unique representational content. In this task, perceptual psychology fruitfully draws on biological and ecological knowledge about the kind of organism whose perceptual capacities are being studied. From the vast range of possible objects of representation in a given perceptual state, scientific explanation can systematically privilege those that are "ecologically relevant to the individual's basic functions -- functions such as eating, navigating, mating, fleeing danger" (94).

This explanatory interaction between perceptual psychology and biology might suggest to some philosophers that there is, after all, a notion of error that applies to all forms of sensory states, perceptual or not. Why not say, for instance, that a sensory state is veridical when it aids the organism in fulfilling its biological function and non-veridical when it frustrates that function? Where Burge's theory posits a fundamental break between sensation and perception, this "deflationary" strategy promises to retain a sense of a continuity of representational function -- from simple to complex -- to match our sense of the continuity of anatomy and physiology between the amoeba's sensitivity to light and the primate's visual system (cf. 319).

Against such deflationism (attributed to Dretske (1986) and Millikan (1989)), Burge maintains that veridicality conditions involve a distinctive norm that cannot be reduced to the norm of biological function. There is, indeed, a "root mismatch between representational error and failure of biological function":

Deflationist theories are part of a long, failed tradition of assimilating truth and accuracy to contribution to practical success, and falsity and inaccuracy to practical failure. Error need not be a failure or frustration of any independently identifiable biological function. Representational success need not fulfill any biological function. (301)

Burge's point is subtle, and easy to misunderstand: this "root mismatch" in no way entails that well-functioning perceptual capacities are irrelevant to, let alone typically frustrate, an organism's pursuit of its biological interests. It is rather that when they do contribute to biological fitness, as they often do, "it is not the accuracy per se that makes the contribution" (302). Take, for instance, the contribution of a sensory system to predator detection, frequently cited as a paradigm case of perception's close relation to biological function. Burge writes:

Detection is, however, not in itself a biological function, as 'biological function' is standardly understood. Detection failure is not in itself a failure of biological function. It is the contribution to response, and ultimately to fitness, not the detection per se, that is biologically functional. (302)

The nature of the "root mismatch" between representational and biological function can be seen by appreciating the fact that an organism's fitness might be enhanced by its predator detection mechanisms overtriggering -- and thereby misrepresenting -- if, for instance, those triggering mechanisms also serve to increase the organism's strength and agility (302).

Thus, the veridicality conditions attaching to perceptual states mark the presence of a representational norm distinct from any norm arising from biological functions. The claim that distinct kinds of norms attach to biological and representational function is quite compatible with holding that the organism's basic biological needs enter into the individuation of representational contents and, moreover, that the representational capacities themselves came about through a process of evolution by natural selection. Burge summarizes:

The explanatory content and goals of theories of perception and belief are not the same as those that underwrite biology. Explaining the way veridical and non-veridical representational states arise, given proximal stimulation, is a different explanatory enterprise from that of explaining any states in terms of their biological functions -- their contributions to fitness. So biological explanations cannot reduce explanations whose point is to explain accuracy and inaccuracy of representational states… . The fact that biological functions of sensory systems are relatively close to representational functions makes psychology possible. The fact that biological functions are not the same as representational functions helps make psychology independently interesting. (303)

Burge further singles out three features of perceptual systems as particularly worthy of note. (1) Perceptual systems are domain specific: each perceptual system (for instance, vision) delivers representations of only a relatively small number of attributes (for instance, shape, brightness, color). "Representation as such" of more complex objects and properties -- pianos and tea cups -- "depends on capacities that go beyond the perceptual system proper" (101). (2) Perceptual systems are (relatively) encapsulated: they function relatively independently of input from each other and from higher level cognitive faculties relating to belief and language (101-102). (The qualification "relatively encapsulated" is crucial: Burge is well aware of apparent counterexamples such as speech perception.) (3) Perceptual systems are shared across species: for instance, vision functions in the same way, by and large, across most mammalian species (102).

Against this background, the aim is to describe a set of processes taking sensory states as inputs and yielding perceptual states as outputs (342). These processes are computational, "quasi-algorithmic," "quasi-automatic" transitions, following law-like patterns (346). The key insight, which will provide Burge's main critical leverage against mainstream philosophy of mind and perception, is that there is no sense in which these "formation principles" (as he calls them) are implemented by the perceiver; nor, even, that they are "accessible to" or "represented in" the perceptual system itself. The perceptual system operates according to these principles, but no more represents them than the solar system represents Kepler's or Newton's laws (404).

So far, perceptual constancies are still largely peripheral to Burge's account of representational capacities. They become more central as the book's argument gathers pace and detail. Constancies -- "capacities to represent environmental attributes, or environmental particulars, as the same, despite radically different proximal stimulations" (114) -- figure centrally in the account of these formation principles. Indeed, it would be hard to overestimate their importance to Burge's account of perception. Constancies "are at the heart of the psychology of perception and the roots of objective reference" (233-4). They constitute the "central instances of perceptual objectification" (397). Perception, he writes, "requires perceptual constancies" (399); "A perceptual system achieves objectification by -- and I am inclined to believe only by -- exercising perceptual constancies" (408). In short, constancies are "certainly sufficient" for perception; he "conjectures" that they are also necessary (413).

The picture that emerges, then, is that perception -- objectified representation -- is the product of autonomous low-level computational processes largely contained within each perceptual system. These processes are unconscious and automatic, "not imputable to the individual perceiver" (24). The quasi-algorithmic formation principles that describe these processes are not themselves represented either within the system itself or more broadly within the psychology of the perceiver. The processes that yield perception are, in a word, subindividual processes. However, Burge carefully argues that the perceptual states yielded by these processes are nonetheless rightly counted -- "necessarily and constitutively" (369) -- as states of the whole organism. This insight throws light on the connection between perception and agency, about which Burge offers many illuminating observations (in particular 326-341). The relevant notion of agency "is grounded in functioning, coordinated behavior by the whole organism, issuing from the individual's central behavioral capacities, not purely from subsystems" (331). Perception allows individuals to "represent goals of, obstacles to, or threats to their activities" (370), and is thus key to "individuals' fulfilling basic whole-animal functions" such as eating, navigating, and mating (371).[3]

2. Against Individual Representationalism

These insights from perceptual psychology give Burge critical leverage on the development of mainstream philosophy of mind over the last 100-odd years. We saw above how Burge criticizes deflationists for collapsing the distinction between sensation and perception altogether. A much more prominent role in the book's dialectic, however, is given to what he calls Individual Representationalism (IR). Unlike deflationism, IR does make room for a distinction between sensation and perception. However, it severely mischaracterizes the distinction and the nature of the capacities that underlie objective representation.

IR comprises a vast array of different philosophical approaches, but common to them all is the idea that the transition from sensation to perception comes about through something the individual does, i.e., that perception is the product of actions or procedures that are in some sense imputable to the individual. On these sorts of views, an individual is presented with sensory data (insufficient in themselves to yield objective representation) and, by the performance of some kind of cognitive operation, interprets or restructures the sensory data in such a way as to yield perception. In this sense, IR assumes that the individual must first be possessed of a significant range of general cognitive capacities in order to be able to perceive objects and properties in her environment. As such, Burge argues, IR is guilty of "hyper-intellectualizing" the requirements on perception. An obvious consequence of such hyper-intellectualization is that organisms which lack such capacities -- for instance, children and non-human animals -- cannot be said to perceive or represent their environment. A less obvious consequence, though no less important to the book's central theoretical and empirical concerns, is that perception could not, then, be regarded as an autonomous representational capacity, inasmuch as it would be dependent on higher-order cognitive capacities in order to fulfill its representational purport.

Burge distinguishes two major strands of IR. According to "first family" IR, perceptual representations are constructed out of more primitive (non-objective) representational materials such as ideas or sense data. This view was dominant in the first half of the twentieth century not just in analytic philosophy (through figures such as Russell, Carnap, Moore, Broad, and Ayer) and continental philosophy (Husserl, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, and to a lesser extent Cassirer); it was also absorbed into much of contemporary psychology through the work of Wundt, James, and Piaget.

Burge's criticism of Russell is instructive. On Russell's view, sense data constitute "the first objects of perception" (118). Such sense data are "always distinguished from physical objects and properties" (118); indeed, "representation and knowledge of the physical environment are derivative," "go[ing] through definite descriptions constructed, through sophisticated logical devices, from acquaintance with sense data and with descriptive universals" (118). Thus, "Russell holds that not only knowledge but the very representation of the physical world is derivative. Both depend on descriptions embedded in complex propositional thought" (119). Against this view, Burge maintains both that representation of particulars in the physical environment is primitive, in the sense that no level of representation precedes it, and moreover that it is autonomous, i.e., not dependent on, or coeval with, more general cognitive capacities such as would be involved in propositional thought.

It is, however, second family IR, which ascended to dominance in analytical philosophy in the second half of the twentieth century, that provides Burge's primary critical focus. Second family IR owes many of its characteristics to a distinctive focus on language and linguistic capacities (138). In various ways, representatives of second family IR hold that perceptual reference requires the individual to have already mastered language and the complex individuative and quantificational apparatus that comes with it. More generally, even while eschewing first family IR's idea that perception is a construction from more primitive representational materials, second family IR still requires perceiving individuals already to have "psychological resources to represent preconditions of objectivity" (139), including a distinction between appearance and reality.

Burge spends a massive 130 pages detailing the hyper-intellectualizing excesses of Strawson, Evans, Quine, and Davidson. I think he is right that their contributions form a cohesive trajectory of thought; moreover, Burge's criticism of the claims and presuppositions guiding this trajectory is, to my mind, devastating.

From the wealth of textual detail that Burge offers, I can here only cull some particularly revealing examples. According to Strawson, singular representation requires general criteria of distinctness and reidentification (176-7), which means "being able to represent, and being disposed to accept, general propositional verification principles for counting a continuously existing body in space as the same over time" (178). If singular representation requires representing general propositions of any form, then perceptual capacities are neither autonomous nor wide-spread in the animal kingdom. Burge comments:

[Strawson] does not consider the idea that one could single out a particular by perceiving it, without any help from propositional thought or propositional knowledge. He does not consider the idea that propositional perceptual thought might simply capitalize on perceptual reference to particulars. (179)

Evans holds that an "informational state" which "carries information about a particular object" is "not itself perceptual," but rather "becomes perceptual when combined with a propositional-conceptual framework that is supposed to be a necessary condition on there being perceptual states" (184). Here Burge finds Evans relying on unstated arguments which connect perceptual representation with consciousness (the latter necessary for the former) and consciousness with propositional thought (ditto). Burge finds these arguments shot through with problems at practically every turn (188).

Similarly shoddy, often merely half-stated arguments, can be found in Quine and Davidson. From Quine's slogan "no entity without identity," it follows that "an individual [must] be able to represent the general conditions under which objects of any given kind are the same or different, if the individual is to represent an entity of that kind at all" (235). This general ability in turn requires highly sophisticated linguistic abilities: "the ability to individuate is supposed to depend on mastering a linguistic apparatus of plurals, identity, negation, pronouns, and quantifiers" (236). Finally, on Davidson's view, objective representation requires that the individual have a concept of objectivity. This requirement has further ramifications: "Davidson associates, sometimes identifies, a concept of objectivity with a concept of truth as applied to propositional belief. He understands such application to require that the individual have not only beliefs, but a concept of belief, and beliefs as of beliefs" (266).

Burge is indisputably right that perceptual abilities must precede these more sophisticated general cognitive capacities and, moreover, that autonomous perceptual abilities are fully present in a wide range of animals that will never develop these higher cognitive capacities at all. Thus, considered as contributions to a theory of perception, at least, the views of Strawson, Evans, Quine, and Davidson have very little to be said in their favor. The qualification, however, is important. Burge sometimes chides second family IR theorists for simply failing to account for perception at all (typically through an excessive focus on referential phenomena in language (cf. 148)), only to go on to read their arguments as bearing -- poorly -- precisely on the missing account of perception. (That said, it is still plausible that the theories of Strawson, Evans, Quine, and Davidson are excessively intellectualistic even when considered specifically as accounts of the requirements on linguistic reference.)

I believe Burge's criticism of the larger trajectory of second family IR is quite generally devastating. Nonetheless, many will no doubt feel that his readings of the main culprits are uncharitable on several points of detail, and will note how Burge appears to consistently seek to maximize the contrast between his own views and those of Strawson, Evans, Quine, and Davidson. This is regrettable, in the sense that it will likely distract some readers from appreciating the force of Burge's more general critical concerns. Here are some prominent examples.

Strawson writes: "I shall mean by a non-solipsistic consciousness, the consciousness of a being who has a use for the distinction between himself and his states, on the one hand, and something not himself or a state of himself, on the other." By contrast, a solipsistic consciousness is one "who has no use for this distinction" (Strawson 1959: 69). Burge comments:

The claim is that avoiding solipsism depends on being able to represent a seems/is distinction, or being able to employ a meta-point of view that distinguishes experiences from objects of experience. Strawson's terminology suggests that he thinks that an ability to draw such a distinction is a condition on reference to a physical world. Whether or not Strawson intends this position, his terminology entails that lacking the capacity to take up a meta point of view, an individual thinker is, by default, a solipsist. (162-3).

He then adds a most curious footnote: "If 'solipsist' is taken to have no other meaning than that stipulated by Strawson, this aspect of Strawson's position does not entail Individual Representationalism. Meanings do not work that way, however" (163n22): 'solipsist,' he notes, is a term with an "antecedent meaning -- not a neologism" (163). Strawson, by contrast, quite clearly does presume his right to define his technical terminology as he pleases and to have his arguments understood accordingly. It is hard to see how invoking a term's "antecedent meaning" could undermine this right. Was Leibniz similarly constrained in his use of "monad" or Kant in his use of "transcendental"? For that matter, would Burge allow readers of his own work to dispute his special sense of "individualism," citing the term's "antecedent meaning"? Whatever one's general policy on this, it is hard to shake the sense that Burge is here uncharitably seeking to maximize the contrast between Strawson's views and his own by denying Strawson the right to have his technical terminology understood in the way that he clearly intended.

Among Evans's most characteristic doctrines is the claim that while singular reference in language can occur without the speaker knowing a uniquely individuating fact about the referent, different considerations apply to singular reference in thought. That is, Evans questions the inference from the fact that subjects might be "capable of referring to -- saying things about -- individuals which they could not distinguish from others" to the conclusion that they could also "hold beliefs about -- be thinking of -- those same individuals" (Evans 1982: 74). The resulting view, Burge notes, "is not self-evident… . it was under attack in philosophy even at the time Evans wrote" (196). This observation is backed up with reference to the work of Donnellan (1966; 1970) and Kripke (1972). One can only hope that this is not meant to imply that Evans was unaware of these developments or else guilty of not taking them into account. Several of the arguments from Evans that Burge criticizes are presented precisely as rebuttals of the Kripke-Donnellan line (cf. Evans 1982: ch. 3). There is certainly room for disagreement about the merits of Evans's arguments against the putatively psychological (as opposed to merely semantic) consequences of direct reference theory. But it borders on the disingenuous to suggest that these arguments simply fail to take into account the new wave in philosophy of language and mind heralded by Kripke and Donnellan.[4]

Turning to Quine, Burge picks up on the indeterminacy of reference thesis, attributing to Quine the following view: "since a pattern of behavioral responses can be taken to be equally a pattern of responses to all of these possible referents [masses, light arrays, temporal stages of objects, etc.], there is no ground to take the referent of a piece of language to be any one of the possibilities" (212). He goes on to observe that this view overlooks "the fact that perceptual content is constrained by the subject matters of ethology and zoology [which] relate animals to key environmental entities that figure in their needs and activities" (213). No doubt, this is correct as far as it goes. However, the observation is set in relief by Quine's arguments elsewhere that we do indeed possess "an innate standard of similarity," "part of our animal birthright," which is, moreover, "characteristically animal in its lack of intellectual status" (Quine 1969: 123). In several discussions, Quine provides important anticipations of many of the themes found in Burge's book. For instance, he writes: "Our innate standards of perceptual similarity show a gratifying tendency to run with the grain of nature. This concurrence is accountable, surely, to natural selection" (Quine 1973: 19; see also Quine 1996, where he ties these lessons more closely to the indeterminacy of reference thesis).

Finally, attacking Davidson's views on the role of triangulation in fixing intentional content, Burge writes:

[Davidson] maintains that the only way to ground a specific content for representational states is to appeal to a communication situation in which a speaker and interpreter are fixed on a common entity in the distal environment. Thus, not only an ability to speak a language, but actually being interpreted by another person, is supposed to be necessary for having a concept of objectivity. And having a concept of objectivity is supposed to be necessary for representation of, and as of, the physical environment. (269)

Burge is certainly right to criticize Davidson's claim that possessing a concept of objectivity is a precondition for representation. Moreover, I think he is right to suggest that the supposed philosophical significance of the triangulation-metaphor remains obscure despite Davidson's best efforts.[5] But Burge's rendering is deeply inconsistent with any reasonable construal of what Davidson means to say. Surely, it cannot be that perceptual reference is grounded in actual linguistic interactions between speaker and hearer, as if we could have full-blown language but no perceptual content. On the contrary, Davidson argues that "Without this sharing of reactions to common stimuli, thought and speech would have no particular content -- that is, no content at all" (Davidson 1991: 212). Indeed, he quite explicitly describes triangulation as a "prelinguistic, precognitive situation [constituting] a necessary condition for thought and language" (Davidson 1997: 128). On Davidson's view, all representational content -- in language or perception -- is grounded in causal interactions of this form. This view is still in marked conflict with Burge in holding that language acquisition and perceptual representation are coeval, but it is at least not hopelessly and obviously confused.

In spite of these uncharitable readings, Burge's criticism of second family IR harbors genuine insights. Individual Representationalism wrongly assumes that the transition from sensation to perception requires the individual to possess further higher-order cognitive capacities, and must be brought about by the individual applying these capacities. First family and second family IR differ mainly in their view of the characteristics of the raw materials of sensation and in their view of what the individual needs to do to these raw materials in order to produce perceptual representation. They are agreed, however, that the sensory materials themselves are insufficient and that the individual must draw on general cognitive capacities. Against this, Burge argues that perception is autonomous, i.e., has no need of supplementary capacities, and is the most primitive kind of representation, i.e., is not preceded by or coeval with the individual's ability to represent general principles, say, of individuation and reidentification. On his view, for which he claims support in recent scientific work, perception comes about through subindividual computational processes within the sensory system itself. These processes operate according to, or instantiate, certain quasi-algorithmic, computational principles, but these principles are not themselves represented within the system.

3. Two objections

There is much to learn from Burge's account of perception. However, one worry that even the most sympathetic readers might entertain is that the account is too strongly centered on vision. To some extent, Burge is unapologetic about this: vision is not just "the best understood" (89) and most "thoroughly studied perceptual system" (420); it is also "the most impressive" (420).

These claims may be warranted, but do not themselves address the worry that starting from vision can blind us to the claims of other sensory systems. Olfaction might be a case in point. Burge evinces a general skepticism toward the claim of chemical senses such as olfaction and gustation to be perceptual. This skepticism is based not on projection from the comparatively low resolution of human olfaction,[6] but rather on general concerns about the character of chemical sensory input, in particular the "changing and relatively amorphous character of the chemical blends carried in air, or, for fish, in water" (415). It is not clear, however, just how great a problem this is. The scientific literature concurs that olfaction may be unique in terms of the challenges it must overcome due to the inconstancy of its input stimulus (cf. Gottfried 2010: 629). In spite of these challenges, however, there appears to be an emerging consensus that olfaction is a properly perceptual capacity, that is, a sensory capacity for objectified representation marked by strong figure-ground segregation resulting from modality-specific constancy mechanisms. (Cf. Stevenson and Wilson 2007; Barnes et al. 2008; Gottfried 2010.)[7]

Burge's most detailed discussion of olfaction concerns salmon homing behavior. As is well known, the salmon is capable of crossing thousands of miles to return to its home stream, for significant stretches of which it relies largely on olfaction. In spite of this impressive feat, the salmon's olfactory abilities are not perceptual, according to Burge.

Burge's analysis is subtle and complex, drawing on a wealth of empirical detail. In the end, however, it is not clear that it succeeds. Recall that Burge points to constancies as the hallmark of perceptual representation. He concedes that many features of the salmon's olfactory system might resemble constancy mechanisms. Specifically, salmon olfaction evinces "a kind of mimicking of direction constancy" (424). But mimicking is not enough: "in the absence of any genuine representation, marked by veridicality conditions not trivially replaceable by accounts in terms of functional registrations of information, there is no true perceptual constancy" (424). What is missing from the salmon's olfactory abilities that renders them merely sensory rather than perceptual?

A capacity to localize a distal source of stimulation without serial sampling is a reliable sign of perceptual objectification. Localization is a capacity to determine direction and distance… . As far as is known, the salmon's olfactory system lacks any sensory state that determines both direction and distance of any object or property (427).

Perhaps Burge is right to claim that salmon homing does not involve true direction constancy. But it would be overhasty to conclude from its failure to evince direction constancy -- or any of the other constancies familiar from vision -- that salmon olfaction is not perceptual. These constancies are impressive and high-grade instances of perceptual objectification. It does not follow that olfaction may not evince other sorts of constancies.[8] In particular, the bare minimum definition of what it is for a sensory system to engage in perceptual objectification need make no reference to these specific kinds of constancy mechanisms.

Burge writes: "Objectification is formation of a state with a representational content that is as of a subject matter beyond idiosyncratic, proximal, or subjective features of the individual" (397). There can be no doubt, to my mind, that salmon olfaction satisfies this simpler and more intuitive definition of what perception is, even if it does not evince the -- perhaps more impressive -- constancies familiar from vision. (Ditto, of course, for vultures, bloodhounds, homing pigeons, etc.) The salmon is quite evidently capable of decomposing complex and constantly shifting olfactory stimuli to extract and recognize particular odor profiles, and -- importantly -- to take these odor profiles as indicating stable distal properties or objects, e.g., its natal stream. In their widely cited study, Dittman and Quinn evince no qualms about describing this with locutions such as "olfactory recognition of homestream water" (not, to wit, "recognition of chemical profile of homestream water"; certainly not "responses to stimulation caused by chemical profile of homestream water"). According to Dittman and Quinn, salmon learn "chemical characteristics of their natal stream prior to or during their seaward migration, remember them without reinforcement during ocean residence, and respond to them as adults." Moreover, they emphasize that "the homing migration is not a simple response to stimuli," since many salmon populations do not migrate directly but are capable of holding for long periods along the way, in spite of a constant barrage of the relevant chemical stimulus (Dittman and Quinn 1996: 83, 86, 87).

Are such apparently representational locutions "trivial" or "too easily replaceable" by explanations in terms of simple sensory registrations? Burge gives us no firm grounds for deciding. What is clear, to my view, is that by invoking perceptual objectification in explaining salmon homing, we would do several things at once, all of which intersect with the central points of Burge's own account: we invoke states that (i) involve significant constancy mechanisms, (ii) that guide whole-animal action, and (iii) that connect up in crucial ways with the animal's fulfillment of its basic biological functions, such as mating. Other than a bias resulting from overhasty generalizations from the case of vision, I see no reason, within Burge's own best thinking, why salmon olfaction should not count as a perceptual capacity.

Finally, a larger-picture worry arises from the book's peculiarly reductive account of what we are capable of perceiving, properly speaking. We can see this in terms of Burge's characterization of perceptual systems as "domain specific" (101). Domain specificity entails that each perceptual system has only a limited array of perceptual attributives at its disposal. Thus, for instance, "Visual systems have attributives for shape, spatial relations, color, motion, texture, perhaps danger, food, conspecifics, and so on" (546). One striking thing about this proposal is that, barring food and conspecifics (about which Burge evidently displays some hesitation), none of these attributives indicate objects in any straightforward sense. If so, one might wonder what is wrong, after all, with Elizabeth Spelke's proposal that "object apprehension" is not in general a perceptual affair, but rather "a cognitive act, brought about by a mechanism that begins to operate at the point where perception ends" (Spelke, 1988: 199). On this view, "object perception may not depend on a visual mechanism at all but on a mechanism that is more central" (Spelke 1988: 215). In short, if what we perceive is largely restricted to shape, color, texture, etc., then it would appear that object synthesis -- to employ old-fashioned language -- must be a product of some variety of post-perceptual cognitive processing. Thus, what perceptual constancies provide, on their own, is not objectification, but only the raw materials thereof.

In response, Burge targets the strongest possible reading of this argument, according to which object apprehension never occurs within particular perceptual modalities. This allows Burge to refute Spelke simply by pointing to evident cases of properly intramodal object perception (439). However, this still leaves open the possibility that such perceptual object apprehension is a relative rarity, all things considered. And this seems, indeed, to be the discouraging upshot of Burge's brief offer of "glimpses forward" in the book's closing chapter. Here Burge provides, at long last, some reflections on the transition between non-propositional perceptual processes and propositionally structured perceptual belief, so evidently characteristic of human empirical cognition. He notes that perceptual beliefs which operate only with conceptualizations of the relevant range of attributives (shape, color, texture, etc.) can be called "basic perceptual beliefs." He acknowledges, however, that we also have perceptual beliefs which are not thus basic, but rather "'perceptual' in a broader sense," namely those that involve familiar everyday objects such as "baseball bats, CD-players, hybrid autos," and so on. What can we say about these? Burge's response is, to my mind, a let-down: while they do not involve conceptualizations of perceptual attributives, they nonetheless "depend for their empirical application on perceptual attributives. Attributives for baseball bats depend for their application on the size, shape, color that baseball bats in fact have." The implication, if I understand Burge here, is that we do not perceive CD-players and baseball bats, but only (reliably) form beliefs about their presence on the basis of perceiving attributes such as color, shape, and texture.

This strikes me as an oddly reductive account of our visual capacities, one which does grave injustice to the dynamic nature of human empirical cognition. A more promising account, in my view, would have it that precisely in part by exercising our perceptual capacities we can acquire a range of new perceptual attributives which goes well beyond the highly limited set of attributives that we share, presumably as a matter of innate endowment, with most or all mammalian species.

Burge evidently senses the need to define perceptual systems in neatly modular terms, as encapsulated both from each other as well as from higher cognitive processes. Allowing a fluid interface between perception and conceptual cognition would evidently put strain on any attempt to draw neat boundaries around each perceptual system. But in my view, such line-drawing efforts are misguided, or at any rate, extraneous to the line of thought that really ought to occupy Burge. Conceding that mature human cognition is marked by a significant integration of perceptual and conceptual capacities (a theme of central importance to the philosophical tradition that Burge is criticizing) would in no way force him to give up on what I take to be his core insights, namely that perceptual capacities, whether in humans or other species, are, first, autonomous, in the sense that they are constitutively independent of such higher cognitive capacities, and, second, primitive, in the sense that they are not preceded, developmentally or phylogenetically, by any other capacity for objectified representation (and certainly not preceded by any capacity for conceptual or linguistic representation).[9]


Akins, Kathleen. 1996. "Of Sensory Systems and the Aboutness of Mental States." Journal of Philosophy 93 (7): 337-372.

Barnes, D.C., R.D. Hofacer, A.R. Zaman, R..L. Rennaker, and D.A. Wilson. 2008. "Olfactory Perceptual Stability and Discrimination." Nature Neuroscience 11(12): 1378-80.

Bridges, Jason. 2006. "Davidson's Transcendental Externalism." Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 73(2): 290-315.

Burge, Tyler, 1979. "Individualism and the Mental." Midwest Studies in Philosophy 4(1): 73-121.

Burge, Tyler. 1986. "Individualism and Psychology." Philosophical Review 95(1): 3-45.

Burge, Tyler. 2003. "Perceptual Entitlement." Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 67(3): 503-548.

Davidson, Donald. 1991. "Three Varieties of Knowledge." Reprinted in Subjective, Intersubjective, Objective. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2001.

Davidson, Donald. 1997. "The Emergence of Thought." Reprinted in Subjective, Intersubjective, Objective. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2001.

Dennett, Daniel. 1971. "Intentional Systems." Journal of Philosophy 68(4): 87-106.

Dittmann, Andrew and Thomas Quinn. 1996. "Homing in Pacific Salmon: Mechanisms and Ecological Basis." Journal of Experimental Biology 199(1): 83-91.

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Evans, Gareth. 1982. The Varieties of Reference. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Gottfried, Jay. 2010, "Central Mechanisms of Odour Object Perception." Nature Reviews Neuroscience 11(9): 628-641.

Helmholtz, Herman v. 1857-67. Handbuch der Physiologischen Optik. 3 vols. Leipzig: Leopold Voss.

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Quine, W.v.O. 1969. "Natural Kinds." In Ontological Relativity, and other Essays. New York: Columbia University Press.

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Sela, Lee and Noam Sobel. 2010. "Human Olfaction: A Constant State of Change-Blindness." Experimental Brian Research 205(1): 13-29.

Spelke, Elizabeth. 1988. "Where Perceiving Ends and Thinking Begins: The Apprehension of Objects in Infancy." In A. Younas, ed., Perceptual Development in Infancy. Hillsdale, NJ: Lawrence Erlbaum.

Stevenson, Richard and Donald Wilson. 2007. "Odour Perception: An Object Recognition Approach." Perception 36(12):1821-1833.

Strawson, P.F. 1959. Individuals: An Essay in Descriptive Metaphysics. London: Methuen.

[1] Thus, Dennett's "stance-stance" (cf. Dennett 1971) is summarily dismissed because, by holding that "treating something as engaging in representation is … all a matter of practical convenience or optional attitude toward the phenomena," it "ignores explanatorily relevant distinctions in science" (293). A more charitable reading of Dennett would presumably emphasize the extent to which adopting the intentional stance toward a particular organism is precisely not optional given the explanatory aims of scientific psychology. Overall, there is reason to think that Dennett would find virtually every aspect of Burge's account congenial to his own, except for the putatively metaphysical status of the distinction between sensation and perception.

[2] This is, no doubt, an oversimplification, though, I hope, one that serves to illustrate the basic contrast. Burge credits Kathleen Akins (1996) as a source of much of his own interest in these topics. Akins's pathbreaking paper argues against the traditional view that sensory systems serve to provide the brain with objective information about environing conditions. Starting from the case of thermoreception, she instead portrays sensation as characteristically narcissistic, which is not to say that sensory systems never provide accurate information about the world, but rather that the information they provide is peculiarly biased and "always has a self-centered glow" (Akins 1996: 345).

[3] One might ask what comes of anti-individualism in all of this. The distinctively social anti-individualism of Burge (1979) is not prominent in the book. Instead, Origins of Objectivity constitutes a culmination of the line of thought that started with Burge (1986). Anti-individualism figures primarily through the claims (i) that causal relations to objects in the environment figure centrally in the individuation of psychological states, and (ii) that the transition from sensation to perception is not attributable to the individual. For a likely source of the latter view, see Burge (2003), which also marked his first extended foray into cognitive ethology.

[4] Thanks to Rick Grush for discussions of Strawson and Evans.

[5] For an illuminating critical examination, see Bridges (2006).

[6] Though note Sela and Sobel (2010), who point out that our olfactory abilities are actually rather more acute than we are inclined to believe. They speculate that the relatively peripheral role of olfaction in human psychology owes instead to the confluence of two factors: first, human olfaction offers little scope for attentional shifts within the olfactory scene. Attentional abilities require spatiality, but olfaction in humans is largely non-spatial. Second, unlike vision and audition, which benefit from a largely continuous sensory input, olfaction -- at least in human beings -- is fundamentally discontinuous, packaged in discrete sniffs. This produces, they argue, a continuous state of change anosmia, analogous to change blindness in vision.

[7] Surveying this literature does, however, raise the question of olfaction's reliance on memory. Figure-ground segregation and object recognition in olfaction is said to be largely dependent on matching with chemical profiles stored from previous exposure. To Burge, this suggests a problem. He observes that we ordinarily tend to classify, say, the olfactory discriminatory capacities of oenophiles as perceptual. He argues, to the contrary, that olfactory objectification is not perceptual, properly speaking, as it "seems to depend on conceptual association and conceptual memory" (415). Here, then, is one case where "ordinary language tends to blur natural psychological kinds" (416). This may or may not be the case for humans. But more generally, it is doubtful that olfaction's putative reliance on memory in say, rodents, renders it non-perceptual. "Memory" here does not denote a higher cognitive capacity, independent of the various sensory modalities. Instead, it is simply the capacity to store a cache of chemical imprints, and is anatomically and functionally integral to the olfactory sense itself.

[8] Cf. Barnes et al. 2008.

[9] Many thanks to Holly Andersen and Martin Hahn for extensive discussions and written feedback. Thanks also to Lydia du Bois, Rick Grush, Tereza Hadravová, Brian Keeley, Tyke Nunez, Simon Pollon, Bjørn Ramberg, Rob Stainton, and Vera Yuen.