Ostension: Word Learning and the Embodied Mind

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Chad Engelland, Ostension: Word Learning and the Embodied Mind, MIT Press, 2014, 305pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262028097.

Reviewed by David Macarthur, The University of Sydney


I want to begin by saying how much I admire the lucid prose and philosophical sophistication of this fine book, which was a genuine pleasure to read and think about. It aims "to begin to rethink philosophy and human nature in light of ostension" (217) -- an aspiration at once humble and ambitious. Regarding its desiderata for a rethinking of philosophy, in particular, the book is very impressive, whether or not one shares the author's advocacy of a curious blend of Aristotelian "natural philosophy" and phenomenology (150, 170). Chad Engelland succeeds admirably in his aspiration to write philosophy in clear non-technical non-ideological language that builds on insights of both analytic and continental philosophy, providing a renewed sense of the timelessness of philosophy -- the relevance of long-dead philosophers from other eras and cultures to contemporary philosophical debates. The book also keeps faith with the recent trend towards a style of scientifically informed philosophy that is often motivated by, and wants to claim the support of, the latest scientific findings. In its broadest terms it explores the possibility of human communication, asking about "the condition for the possibility of dialogue about things" (216). Engelland attempts to make a beginning in answering this problem of triangulation (self-other-thing), familiar from Donald Davidson's work, by addressing a more specific question: "How do children learn the meanings of their first words?" (3). Call this the First Word Question. The book is a subtle and tireless working out of the thought that ostension in the context of a common human nature provides the answer to this question.

The book consists of an Introduction and eleven chapters. After a short first section on contemporary resources and obstacles offered by philosophy and science (ch. 1-2), there is an historical section uncovering important ideas of four key philosophers (Wittgenstein, Merleau-Ponty, Augustine and Aristotle) who all agree that ostension is the answer to the First Word Question, and that the ostensions of others are available to us by way of their actions (chs. 3-6). These are followed by a section elaborating and defending the proposed answer and its metaphysical implications; as well as answering the crucial problem of the ambiguity of ostension (chs. 7-11). Apart from the chapter-length treatments of the key historical figures listed above, we encounter discussions of developmental psychologists (e.g., Paul Bloom, Michael Tomasello), ancient philosophers (e.g., Plato, Cratylus), medieval philosophers (e.g., Aquinas) early modern philosophers (e.g., Descartes, Hume, Locke), analytic philosophers (e.g., Russell, Austin, Quine, Davidson, Kuhn, Searle, Kripke, Alva Nöe, Evan Thompson, Michael Thompson, Shaun Gallagher, Dan Zahavi) and continental philosophers (e.g., Nietzsche, Husserl, Heidegger, Gadamer, Robert Sokolowski). Part of the writerly charm of this book is that we also come across references to Charlotte Brontë, Gerard Manley Hopkins, T.S. Eliot, Roald Dahl and Woody Allen.

How is the First Word Problem motivated? From the perspective of Anglo-American philosophy, Engelland sees his project as filling in a lacuna in the story about how words are learnt that traces back to Quine's famous discussion of the "ostensive predicament" according to which using the native expression "Gavagai!" in the proximity of a rabbit does not settle whether the word means rabbit, undetached rabbit parts, rabbit stage and so on. Davidson replaces Quine's proximal private evidence (neural stimulations) with distal public evidence (physical objects in one's immediate environment), which may, but need not be, intentionally highlighted by a teacher. What goes missing is an account of "the prelinguistic availability of intentions to others" (4) -- a capacity that developmental psychologists are also ascribing to babies and infants.

Secondly, Engelland stands opposed to Cartesianism as part of the modern philosophical legacy, in the form of two views: (1) that our ultimate evidence for claims about the world is sensory data in our own minds (or brains in materialist versions); and (2) that the minds of others must be inferred from their bodily behavior (understood as an object of scientific study). Here he argues convincingly from phenomenological considerations that we not only experience common objects available in a public space (e.g. trees, houses, chairs) but that we non-inferentially perceive the minds of others as manifested in their behavior. This is a crucial step in Engelland's answer to the First Word Question, which is that prelinguistic infants are able to understand the manifest intentions of others, independently of any explicit training, learning by themselves from others' ostensive acts and thereby coming to appreciate the meanings of first words as standing for things of mutual desire and interest. A residual Cartesianism in the phenomenological tradition -- its over-reliance on the first-person perspective (150) -- is also an important part of Engelland's motivation for a return to Aristotle's natural philosophy and its (supposed) capacity to do justice to our shared intentionality.

Thirdly, the book can be profitably understood as a defense of Augustine against the criticisms leveled by Wittgenstein against the Augustinian "picture of the essence of human language" discussed at the opening of Philosophical Investigations.[1] Setting aside the question of linguistic essentialism, Engelland sees Wittgenstein as misreading Augustine's account of first word acquisition as relying, hopelessly, on ostensive definitions: namely, intentional ostensive acts that simply presuppose (rather than explaining how) one knows the grammar of the kind of thing being indicated. Engelland builds on a fundamental move of Augustine's, that the child can learn from "eavesdropping" (23) without any explicit training and so without any need of ostensive definitions. What the child does require is a natural capacity to understand ostensive acts understood as "bodily movement that manifests our engagement with things, whether we wish it to or not" (xi). According to Engelland the critical roles of Augustine and Wittgenstein are reversed: Augustine's actual position provides the basis to criticize Wittgenstein's view which, as he reads it, is a version of "the modern Western model" of language acquisition whereby "children learn language by being taught." On the contrary, Engelland (following Augustine) claims, "children learn language by teaching themselves" (24).

Each of these motivations deserves critical comment but in the limited space of this review let me pick up this third route into the book's main themes. Engelland recognizes that his aims diverge from Wittgenstein's (43). But this divergence is much greater than he thinks. For a start Wittgenstein is not criticizing Augustine, whose description of an infant's initiation into language is, surely, perfectly in order. What he criticizes is a certain philosophical construal of Augustine's words: one that takes these words to express a fixed and reified conception of the meaning of any and every word as "the object for which it stands."[2] Wittgenstein is not making empirical hypotheses about child development but rather investigating the logic of language ("grammar").[3] He is not to be read as attempting to answer the First Work Question. Indeed he would regard this question with great suspicion since to ask this question is to presuppose a problematic semantic atomism, as if a child could learn the "meanings" of words one by one.

Wittgenstein accepts a radicalized version of Frege's Context Principle ("Never to ask for the meaning of a word in isolation but only in the context of a proposition"[4]) which, in his hands, becomes: never to ask for the meaning of a word in isolation, but only in the context of a proposition that is doing work in the midst of our life with language. Engelland notes that Gadamer disavows the First Word Question (16); and the same would almost certainly be true of Wittgenstein. He would regard the question, asked in this spirit, as a typically philosophical question -- leading to the aporia of acknowledging "I don't know my way about" -- that requires therapeutic diagnosis rather than any attempt at an answer. Like Gadamer he would not think we know what we mean when we speak of wanting a philosophical "theory" of our initiation into language, say, of how "light dawns gradually over the whole."[5] Engelland's attempt to give a definite shape to this issue by formulating the First Word Question requires him to deny or slight the pervasive holism of linguistic meaningfulness as we know it.

Engelland's attempt to turn our initiation into language into a theoretically tractable question also leads him to set up straw-men who accept "the modern Western model" (24), which is committed to the claim that children learn language only by being taught through deliberate ostension, repetition and correction. He contrasts this Teaching-Only Model, which he attributes to Locke, Russell and Wittgenstein, with his preferred Eavesdropping Model, which he finds in Augustine. But why suppose that anyone holds that an infant is initiated into language only by way of being explicitly taught?[6] Why can we not say, as I take it Wittgenstein does, that a child learns language both by eavesdropping (or overhearing) its elders and by being taught by way of training, correcting mistakes, and so on? In other words, Engelland is relying, in the case of our original initiation into language, on a false dichotomy between teaching oneself and learning from others that is simply inapplicable.

An implication of Engelland's Eavesdropping Model is that he is forced to deny that the infant's understanding of its first words requires any correction by parents and carertakers: "correction is rarely needed" (176). However, Engelland's example of his own child's learning the meaning of the word "milk" by himself does not support this claim, in spite of the author's intentions. His son began calling all liquids "milk" including water and urine. But rather than calling this a mistake that requires correction, Engelland redescribes the case as one according to which "he was right that we were speaking about a liquid" and that "he rightly 'overextended' milk" (176)! Clearly, relative to ordinary uses of the term 'milk,' the child does not know the meaning of the term. We might say, charitably, that he has a partial grasp of its meaning. But however we describe the case, the child does not have the right understanding of milk and correction is called for. Engelland's theoretical prejudices here stand in the way of seeing what is plain to see. The upshot is that initiates both eavesdrop on mature language speakers and also require teaching, at least in the form of correction of misunderstandings as in this case.

Another major problem for Engelland's Eavesdropping Model is the ambiguity of ostension, a problem he acknowledges is much discussed in the philosophy of language. If one points to a pine tree it is not clear whether one is indicating a tree, a pine, wood, pine-needles, the colour green, the number one, a physical object etc. What Wittgenstein says about ostensive definition is true of all ostension: "an ostensive definition can be various interpreted in every case."[7] The problem is even greater for Engelland's ostensive acts since his preferred model of language learning requires that he cannot appeal to any prior linguistic know-how or correction by masters of the language for the purposes of disambiguation. Engelland is fully aware of the difficulty: "the infant . . . is in an extremely ambiguous situation" (177). It is here that our author invokes an Aristotelian (essentialist) conception of "a common human nature" (184). Although he mentions the importance of movement, difference, perceptual novelty, context, everyday routines and differential repetition, the task of disambiguation largely rests on the idea that as humans we all share "natural inclinations" (184): "It is our common nature that specifies a human style of individuating things" (183, see also 132). One question is whether this commitment to Aristotelian essentialism is not too high a price to pay here. Another is whether the appeal to natural inclinations really provides the resources to solve, rather than merely qualifying, the ambiguity problem.

I have taken issue with the First Word Question and the distinction between the Teaching-Only and Eavesdropping Models of language learning. Although I think these are significant flaws I want to justify my opening remarks about why this is such an admirable book. Notwithstanding its shortcomings, a great deal of important philosophical work is salvageable from this book even if we set aside its leading question and its account of language learning in infancy. The book can be very profitably read not as a theory of language acquisition but as an account of our capacity to read each other's minds as manifest in our bodily behavior in intersubjective space; what we might more perspicuously call the second-personal space of reciprocal "I -- thou" relationships and their various normative significances. Looked at in this way what comes to the fore is Engelland's discussion of the embodied mind or animate body: in Wittgenstein on reading gestures and facial expressions; and in Merleau-Ponty on the body "as perceivable thing and perceiver of things" which he calls "flesh" (76). Indeed the author's approach to the problem of other minds is worthy of a much longer discussion.

From this perspective the historical materials are not part of the "new beginning" (60) that Engelland takes them to be. The reading of Aristotle recedes into the background. And, despite Engelland's endorsement of it, Augustine's account of non-inferentially perceiving other minds remains puzzling. It seems not to fit comfortably into either camp of metaphysical privacy -- the mind being, at best, inferred from bodily behavior (e.g. Russell) -- nor genuine embodiment according to which mindedness is a matter of world-involving bodily capacities open to public view (e.g. Wittgenstein, Merleau-Ponty). Augustine claims that the minds of others are manifest in their bodily comportment but he adds, in apparent tension with that idea, the religiously inspired thought that the soul (or mind) is invisible (101).

Let me close by warmly applauding Engelland's non-scientific conception of philosophy as a discipline specially concerned with the manifest image of our everyday lives that we are, for the most part, oblivious to. On this vision, science is not a threat to philosophy since it takes for granted and cannot deny or wholly replace the manifest image (contra Sellars): "science… cannot help itself to concepts requisite for [the manifest image's] understanding" (213). Significantly, the living body expressive of human (inter-)subjectivity within the manifest image is not as such an object of scientific inquiry. It is a subject for philosophical study.

Although I have taken issue with the book's official line of inquiry, there are philosophical riches in these pages for philosophers of all stripes. Like all the best books of philosophy, I found this book by turns illuminating and unsettling, continually provoking me to philosophical reflections of my own. Highly recommended.

[1] Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, trans. G. E. M. Anscombe (Blackwell, 1958), §1.

[2] Wittgenstein, Investigations, §1. On the possibility of these two readings of Augustine's passage see: Stanley Cavell, "Notes and Afterthoughts on the Opening of Wittgenstein's Investigations," Cambridge Companion to Wittgenstein, Hans Sluga and David Stern (eds.) (Cambridge University Press, 1996); and Warren Goldfarb, "I Want You to Bring Me a Slab," Synthese vol. 56 (1983): 265-282. On the non-philosophical construal of Augustine's words, Goldfarb writes, "My primary reaction to the citation from the Confessions, read by itself, is to think that what it expresses is obvious -- it seems trivial, prosaic, well-nigh unobjectionable" (268).

[3] Admittedly Wittgenstein's employment of the figure of the child can misleadingly suggest that he is doing armchair psychology: "Am I doing child psychology? -- I am making a connection between the concept of teaching and the concept of meaning." (Ludwig Wittgenstein, Zettel, 2nd ed., trans. G. E. M. Anscombe (Blackwell, 1981), §412)

[4] Frege, The Foundations of Arithmetic, 2nd ed., trans. J. L. Austin (Harper, 1960), xxii.

[5] Wittgenstein, On Certainty, trans. Denis Paul and G. E. M. Anscombe ( Blackwell, 1969), §141.

[6] Wittgenstein, Investigations, §5-6.

[7] Ibid., §28.