Our Bodies, Whose Property?

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Anne Phillips, Our Bodies, Whose Property?, Princeton University Press, 2013, 202pp., $27.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691150864.

Reviewed by James Lindemann Nelson, Michigan State University


Anne Phillips's answer to her title question is "No one's." Or, to put the point more carefully, "no one's" is the answer that is widely reflected in practices and policies throughout contemporary societies, and it is the answer to which Phillips is convinced we should stick fast.

Among many of Phillips's valuable contributions in this deeply thoughtful and attractively written book is showing just why we should be careful how that answer is put. Our understanding of how people make sense of their relationship to their bodies can shape how important social practices are organized: the provision of transplantable organs, of sex, and of children; responses to sexual violence and workplace exploitation. Further, the need for care in thinking about how to pose and pursue questions about whether people own their bodies, ought to be able to sell bits of them, or rent them out, is a function of the complexity of property as a concept. A key plank of Phillips's overall position is that property is woven of many strands of permissions and forbiddings that can be entwined in various ways, as determined by the play of needs, interests, and power in different social arrangements.

The weave can be rather loose. Despite being the owner of an object, I don't always have the authority to damage or destroy it on a whim, or even to sell it to whomever I might chose. Nor does the notion of property itself imply that owners must adopt any very specific attitudes toward what they own. While it might not matter to me if many of my belongings were swapped for equally useful replacements, I might regard others as irreplaceable.

Phillips makes clear how the variety of ways that notions of property are cobbled together can expand how we think of relevant practices and relationships. While conceiving of one's body as something one owns may seem aligned with notions of public interactions that are heavily influenced by market relations, her book is sympathetically, albeit critically, attentive to views on the political left that see bodily ownership as a way to bolster the social standing and self-understanding of those whose bodies have been systematically appropriated by more powerful others. We live in a world where slavery still lingers, and sweatshops and sexual procurement abound. It's not surprising that advocating self-ownership seems a tempting strategy to some critical social theorists, perhaps particularly to some feminists. At the same time, however, many of these critics take advantage of property's open texture to shear off its more individualist associations, tailoring property to suit their other political and moral programs.

Herself an advocate for feminist intellectual and political goals, Phillips's concerns about using the strategy of self-ownership to advance them rest chiefly on her views about how concepts of property, and such related notions as markets, objectification and commodification, tend to influence our thoughts and practices involving ourselves and others. A central worry is that property notions are liable to obscure the importance of something everyone shares -- that "we all have bodies" (p. 10 and variously). Properly understood, our common embodiment bolsters our sense of human equality as familiar and fundamental. In contrast, using property-related concepts to understand our embodiment threatens to weaken our hold on our equality. Given property's flexible content, Phillips doesn't argue that people will necessary be tempted by such inferences as "if we own ourselves, then we must be able to sell ourselves" -- though, of course, some might be. The most worrisome impacts are subtler, but just as insidious. If we think of our bodies as among our belongings, we have connected our self-concept with ideas that highlight what separates us from others. As property holders, we are divided by the immensely varied extent and value of our holdings; across a wide set of moral understandings and a wide set of social contexts, we find ourselves prone to stand on our rights with respect to what we own, inclined to secure and promote our distinctive interests.

On Phillips's view, then, thinking of my body as something I own has consequences that are deep and troubling, notwithstanding the contingency of their connection with ideas of property itself. The distortions are likely to be metaphysical as well as political. Property conceptions nudge me to think of myself not as an embodied unity, but as bifurcated -- there, the body owned, here, the self (or mind, as she catches at least one contemporary philosopher saying (p. 105)) that owns it. Further, despite a reasonable consensus in most sophisticated discourse on property's conceptual complexity, even powerful thinkers sometimes succumb to simpler ways of grasping the idea. Phillips turns twice to G. A. Cohen's characterization of Robert Nozick's conception of self-ownership as comprising "with respect to oneself all those rights which a slave owner has over a complete chattel slave" (pp. 40 and 129). If these tendencies can affect thinkers such as Nozick, the rest of us can't be relied on to altogether escape them. Phillips notes that even if theoreticians explicitly work with nuanced understandings of property -- even, for example, understandings of the body-as-property modulated by an ethic of care -- they cannot legislate which of property's denotations and connotations are socially current.

It is this kind of argumentative tactic -- not, say, based on excavating some minimal content that must be present in any non-equivocal use of 'property,' but rather on observations of connections among ideas and attitudes that now happen to be socially powerful -- that is fundamental for Phillips; much hinges, obviously, on how compelling she can make those connections seem. The book's three central chapters, then, aren't simply applications of a thesis to cases; they importantly contribute to the overall plausibility of her view. The first chapter deals with rape, the second primarily with contractual birthgiving (or "surrogate motherhood" as it is referred to in the text) and the third with human organs and tissues used for transplant or research.

Phillips's discussion of rape is particularly deft. She allows that, historically, rape was understood as a crime against property -- although not as a crime against property owned by the person who was raped. Yet fixing that problem by preserving the notion that bodies are properties and merely shifting who owns them (from a father or a husband, say, to the woman whose body it is) still slights specifically horrific features of rape. Seeing rape merely as "sex minus consent" (p. 49, quoting David Archard) -- as theft might be seen as taking without permission -- misses the crucial and distinctive ways rape is caught up with embodiment and sexuality, with our physical states, subjective responses, and interpersonal connections. Thinking of rape as a kind of trespass, a natural extension of the property theme, obscures how rape "simulate[s] something in which you normally play an active part" and thus hides how "the violation of rape is relational as much as territorial" (p. 56).

It might be tempting to retort that the territorial is often relational, that people often enjoy their property in active ways, and can, for example, feel a sense of violation if, say, their homes are broken into and robbed. While she doesn't explicitly deal with this sort of criticism, Phillips's general attention to what is actual and likely in social affairs left me less than fully satisfied with the prevailing focus on the necessary and the certain, and with such philosophical reflexes as the grab for the quick counterexample. Phillips's resistance to such reflexes is nicely on display when she considers philosophical analyses of scenarios in which an unconscious person is raped, in the effort to capture where rape's essential wrongness resides -- what distinguishes rape from assault, for example. Her approach suggests how clumsy such analyses are, and she plausibly argues how they both feed into and are nourished by the way property-based understandings set aside the connections between rape and the actual experience of embodiment and sexuality.

The "surrogate motherhood" chapter is particularly sensitive to the impact of practices associated with property, since here the focus is on the commercialization and development of markets as they involve birthgiving and its characteristic patterns of feeling. Phillips aims to problematize surrogacy as its proponents understand it -- not as "baby selling" nor as the exploitation of women unable to make emotionally freighted choices, but as the sale of reproductive services, a practice "directly involving the body" (p. 80). This is a characterization no one is likely to dispute.

Even with surrogacy stripped of tendentious characterizations, she finds problems, particularly with its commercialized versions that restrict women's agency during pregnancy. Phillips makes interesting comparisons between surrogacy and marriage: insisting on ready access to divorce isn't a matter of women's (or anyone's) inability to consent validly in emotionally charged contexts, but of the need for easily available exit options from having to employ one's body in the intimate ways expected in marriage. Services we agree to provide with our bodies, she notes, have been typically regarded in law as different from, say, agreements to transfer property. It's common to avoid compelling "specific performance" of contracts that specify that one will use one's body in some fashion, whether cleaning floors or singing arias.

The specific performance critique of surrogacy might then come to seem disconnected from any special focus on "intimate uses" of the body, of the kind that drove the marriage analogy. Yet Phillips welcomes what might appear to be a critical observation, endorsing Mary Shanley's point that, when it comes to what it places at risk, surrogacy is the "extreme instance" that "reveals to us a truth about all kinds of work" (p. 82). Wage labor as such involves agreements with others to use our bodies in return for money. That there is a continuum between the extent of the transfer of authority involved in contracts signed by surrogates and those signed by professors suggests that we may need more caution about academic work, not less about reproductive employment. Caution is needed at all points of this continuum, but particularly with kinds of labor that are hard to see as activities people might choose to do for their own sake, quite apart from the need to make a living.

"Specific performance" considerations may, then, be relevant to assessing demands placed on surrogate birthgivers during pregnancy. Our discomfort with restrictions on what pregnant women may do with their bodies (e.g., forbidding or compelling abortions, restricting sexual expression or diet, insisting on various medical interventions) hint that we don't think of those bodies as objects an owner may let out if and as she likes. It's less apparent how specific performance is relevant to surrogacy's "bottom line" -- the reliable relinquishment of babies.

Phillips cites Elizabeth Anderson's observation that the standing array of social practices that nudge women to feel special attachment to the babies they gestate and deliver are strategically undermined in surrogacy contexts, both by agencies that broker surrogate arrangements and by surrogates themselves. In effect, pregnancy undertaken with the intent to relinquish the child runs against a grain that has been installed deeply in most women; those who broker commercial surrogacy arrangements have to extirpate it, if they are going to make any serious money.

For it is not birthgiving-for-others as such to which Phillips objects -- banning surrogacy would be "an unjustifiable restriction on autonomy" (p. 94). Nor is she opposed to surrogates' receiving compensation and financial recognition for their work -- "a woman agreeing to bear a child for someone else is entitled to some recompense" (p. 94), and if there is some property we may not sell, there are also some exchanges of money involving goods that are not owned. The real problem is posed by the development of markets in female reproductive services, which threaten large-scale distortion of valuable forms of affect and relationship associated with human reproduction. Markets require more than private agreements between two parties, even if the agreement involves money changing hands.

While providing financial reward in ways insulated against the development of markets is not only permissible but required to reduce the chances that women will be exploited in surrogacy arrangements, Phillips has a different view about organ and tissue provision. She favors a presumed consent regimen for organs from the deceased as a way of reducing the lethal supply-demand gap. Relying on fiscal incentives disconnected from markets hasn't the same rationale respecting organs as it does in surrogacy; organ provision is not a gender segregated opportunity, as is surrogacy, and thus the potential for exploitation is lessened. Further, while few surrogates will ever find themselves needing to contract others to give birth for them, the possibility of reciprocity is a structural feature of the organ and tissue situation.

While Phillips is resourceful, in this chapter as earlier, in exploring how contingent connections among property, social practices, and self-understandings bear against body-as-property notions, she does offer what she labels a noncontingent basis for objection to markets in body parts: the "Equality Objection." Common concerns about exploitation of organ vendors have to be reconciled with the fact that markets in general are characterized by inequality. "Our entire world is premised on people doing things for money they would not do for love, and on richer people buying what poorer people sell" (p. 114). Yet markets need not be predicated on inequality alone: in principle, anyway, they also allow people to express, develop, and profit from doing specific kinds of things that they are particularly good at, and, arguably, tend to enjoy doing.

While this benign account of markets no doubt glosses over many of their distressing features, Phillips thinks that it is difficult to see how it can even get off the ground with regard to, say, kidney sales. If you're lucky enough to have a body endowed with athletic or aesthetic or intellectual abilities out of the common way, market exchanges may conceivably be arranged so that they do not exploit or alienate you from your distinctive traits. In contrast, there's nothing very distinctive about having paired kidneys or blood. What drives a person to take her kidney to market can hardly be, then, the desire to enjoy and profit from her special talents; hence, Phillips concludes, markets in human body parts cannot but be based on inequality. They cannot be imagined to exist in circumstances of economic, social, and gender equality.

This does not strike me as convincing. Let's suppose, as seems plausible, that even highly efficient presumed consent procurement systems would not producing enough cadaveric organs to meet growing needs. Mix in Phillips's favored conception of what just social arrangements would look like, including economic equality. Is it inconceivable that financial incentives might prompt some people, who ex hypothesi have the resources they need to live reasonably well, to provide a kidney they otherwise would withhold, to those who would otherwise suffer more and die sooner? It isn't clear to me why vendor motivation couldn't be mixed -- an effective desire to do well by doing good.

In the real world, however, things are otherwise; the bare possibility that some might vend organs they would not donate, but not because their economic situation is unjust, hardly deflects the reasons that Phillips marshals against organ markets -- chiefly, that such markets would undermine attitudes of gratitude, respect and reciprocity that characterize donation, replacing them with tendencies to regard organ providers as resources for the well-off rather than people in their own right. One of the great virtues of Phillips's work overall is her patient, creative exploration of the moral and political importance of contingent but reliable impacts on our network of values of thinking of our bodies as objects we own. That an effort to show that some of those impacts are necessary may have misfired is hardly a reason to worry.


Discussions of Our Bodies, Whose Property? with the members of my graduate seminar in Fall of 2013 -- Amelia Martin, Sophia Pavlos, Eian Kantor, Hannah Guinta, Craig Merow, Alex Neitzke, Monica List, and Nicholas Saarela -- contributed greatly to my grasp of Phillip's work. I am also indebted to Hilde Lindemann for her close reading of a late draft.