Our Fate: Essays on God and Free Will

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John Martin Fischer, Our Fate: Essays on God and Free Will, Oxford University Press, 2016, 243pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199311293.

Reviewed by Martijn Boot, Waseda University


Contemporary debates about free will are dominated by two questions: ‘Is causal determinism true?’ and ‘Is free will compatible with causal determinism?’ These issues are important with respect to the question of to what extent we are morally responsible for our choices and actions. Moral responsibility cannot be detached from some form of free will and self-determination. Parallel to the issue of (in)compatibilism of free will and causal determinism is the question of whether free will and moral responsibility are compatible with divine foreknowledge.

John Martin Fischer investigates the relationship between divine foreknowledge, human freedom and moral responsibility. His book is a collection of eleven previously published essays. Fischer starts with a new introductory article in which he summarizes, extends and applies elements of the analyses presented in the other essays.

Fischer mainly concentrates on the question of whether God’s foreknowledge is compatible with human freedom to do otherwise. But he also pays attention to the still more important question about the compatibility of God’s foreknowledge and human moral responsibility.

Fischer tries to show that the answer to the first question is negative: God’s foreknowledge excludes human freedom to do otherwise. This seems to imply that the answer to the second question is negative as well: God’s foreknowledge is incompatible with human moral responsibility. However, Fischer believes that this doesn’t follow, because, according to him, moral responsibility does not require freedom to do otherwise. I will describe and discuss some of the main arguments Fischer adduces in his book to support these views.

Are divine foreknowledge and freedom to do otherwise reconcilable?

Fischer points out that the arguments for the incompatibility of divine foreknowledge and human freedom to do otherwise are in important ways similar to arguments for the incompatibility of causal determinism and freedom to do otherwise. Both kinds of arguments are related to ideas about the “fixity of the past”. Still there are also relevant differences, which have to be taken into account because the conclusions of the two kinds of arguments with respect to moral responsibility may differ.

Fischer discusses different families of arguments for the incompatibility of God’s foreknowledge and human freedom to do otherwise (‘the Arguments for Incompatibilism’), which are largely based on the premise of ‘the fixity of the past’ and on the so-called Transfer Principle. This principle shows circumstances in which doing X means doing Y, so that if we cannot do Y, we cannot do X. The incompatibilist uses the Transfer Principle by showing that we cannot do X (e.g. we cannot do otherwise) because we cannot do Y (e.g. we cannot bring it about that God held a false belief). Fischer investigates several challenges to the Arguments for Incompatibilism, such as

  • ‘Scotism’: counterexamples to the Transfer Principle, attributed to Duns Scotus and developed by Anthony Kenny;
  • ‘Ockhamism’: based on ideas of William of Ockham who made a distinction between ‘hard’ (temporally nonrelational) and ‘soft’ (temporally relational) facts about the past;
  • ‘Molinism’: inspired by doctrines of the Jesuit philosopher Luis de Molina about God’s ‘middle knowledge’ — knowledge of what free agents would do in various situations.

Fischer defends the Arguments for Incompatibilism against these challenges. He argues that some versions of these Arguments are vulnerable to some challenges, while these challenges do not affect other versions. For instance, Kenny’s counterexamples to one of the versions of the Transfer Principle do not apply to another version. Besides, the Arguments for Incompatibilism do not exclusively depend on the Transfer Principle. So, one could reject some specific Arguments for Incompatibilism without thereby having to reject others. According to Fischer, Molinism provides an interesting model of divine providence but is not a response to the Arguments for Incompatibilism. He shows that, with respect to the issue of incompatibilism, it begs the question and doesn’t help with the specific problem of reconciling God’s foreknowledge with human freedom.

In addition to the previously published articles, Fischer offers some new reflections on related issues. He defends the theological incompatibilist’s argument against the challenge that it begs the question. Further he tries to show that a rejection of Ockhamism does not depend on the claim that God’s beliefs concern hard instead of soft facts about the past. Finally, he argues (against William Hasker, Patrick Todd and others) that, even in a causally indeterministic world (a world in which events are not causally determined), God can know with certainty that some future event will occur. A causally indeterministic world does not prevent an ordinary human being from having a justified and more or less certain belief in what a particular person, given his personal characteristics, will do in a future choice situation. God’s foreknowledge may be partly conceived in a similar way. But unlike a human being, whose beliefs are fallible, God knows that what He believes is true, because he knows that He is omniscient. God can thus ‘bootstrap’ his first-order belief to a second order of certain knowledge (Fischer calls this approach of God’s foreknowledge the Bootstrapping View). In this perspective God’s foreknowledge may be compatible with a causally indeterministic world. This is important with respect to the question of whether God’s foreknowledge can be reconciled with human moral responsibility. Indeed, if God’s foreknowledge would be inextricably bound up with a causally deterministic world, it would probably exclude human moral responsibility. Still, Fischer recognizes that, also if God’s foreknowledge is unrelated to causal determinism, it may be problematic to reconcile it with human moral responsibility, if it excludes the freedom to do otherwise. This problem forms the second main question to which the book pays attention.

Are God’s foreknowledge and moral responsibility reconcilable?

For a detailed discussion and defense of his theory of moral responsibility Fischer refers to previous publications. Many philosophers believe that the sort of freedom required for moral responsibility requires that the agent could have acted differently (the argument of the Principle of Alternative Possibilities). This would mean that incompatibility of God’s foreknowledge and the freedom to do otherwise implies that God’s foreknowledge is incompatible with moral responsibility. However, Fischer tries to make plausible that incompatibility of God’s foreknowledge and human freedom to do otherwise — a freedom that he calls ‘regulative control’ — does not imply that God’s foreknowledge is irreconcilable with human moral responsibility. Moral responsibility requires another kind of freedom than regulative control, namely ‘guidance control’. An individual exhibits guidance control to the extent that he acts from his own mechanism of practical reasoning and human deliberation, as a response to divergent reasons for alternative choices. An agent’s mechanism becomes his own when he ‘takes responsibility’. Thus guidance control consists of two important components: ownership and reasons-responsiveness.

Fischer adduces the following example — inspired by examples given by Harry Frankfurt — to demonstrate that somebody can be held morally responsible for his choice, although he could not have chosen otherwise.

Black has secretly inserted a chip in Jones’s brain. This enables Black to monitor and control Jones’s activities. If, in the presidential election, Jones were to show any inclination to vote for anyone other than the Democrat candidate, then the chip in Jones’s brain would intervene to ensure that he actually decides to vote for the Democrat. But if Jones decides on his own to vote for the Democrat, the chip does nothing. Suppose that Jones decides to vote for the Democrat on his own, just as he would have if Black had not inserted the chip in his head. It seems, upon first thinking about this case, that Jones can be held morally responsible for his choice, although he could not have done otherwise.

Fischer uses this Frankfurt-like approach to support his semicompatibilist view: he believes that divine foreknowledge is incompatible with free choices between alternative possibilities, but compatible with moral responsibility, because moral responsibility does not require freedom to do otherwise.

Some other philosophers, including Derk Pereboom, also do not believe that moral responsibility requires freedom to do otherwise, but they nevertheless hold that moral responsibility requires that the agent be the ‘ultimate source’ of his behavior. Causal determination is incompatible with the agent being the ultimate source of his behavior. Therefore, even if moral responsibility does not require freedom to do otherwise, causal determination seems incompatible with moral responsibility if the ultimate source requirement is right.

However, according to Fischer, his semicompatibilism is not vulnerable to the challenge of source-incompatibilism because, unlike causal determinism, the conception of divine foreknowledge does not exclude that the agent remains the source of his behavior, insofar as God’s foreknowledge is not conceived as causing human action. Still, Fischer points out that, also in the context of God’s foreknowledge and the Frankfurt Cases, something entirely external to the agent and out of his control is sufficient for his behavior. In this sense the source of his behavior is external to him. If, as Fischer believes, this is still compatible with guidance control — and, therefore, with moral responsibility — then this may mean that likewise the external source of the agent’s behavior in the case of causal determinism need not imply that moral responsibility is excluded. Therefore, Fischer argues, his Frankfurt-like approach casts doubt not only on the requirement of alternative possibilities for moral responsibility, but also on the requirement that, to be morally responsible, the agent must be the ultimate source of his behavior.

In sum, Fischer argues that it is at least plausible that, if God knows everything about our future, it follows that we are never free to do otherwise. But he further argues that it does not follow from this lack of regulative control that we lack guidance control of our future. If guidance control is the freedom-relevant condition for moral responsibility, then we can be morally responsible for our behavior, even if God knows everything we will ever do in advance.


Robert Kane notices in the Introduction of The Oxford Handbook of Free Will that contemporary debates about free will in the light of God’s foreknowledge “surpassed even medieval discussions in labyrinthine complexity.” Also Fischer’s profound analyses are complicated and not easily to follow for readers who are not specialized in the relevant issues. Therefore, the book is relevant and important mainly for specialists. Fischer’s argument is interesting not only for specialists who are interested in the (in)compatibility of God’s foreknowledge, the freedom to choose otherwise and moral responsibility but also for specialists who are interested in the (in)compatibility of causal determinism, the freedom to choose otherwise and moral responsibility. The reason is that the two issues have much ground in common, while there are also relevant differences, which Fischer elucidates.

Fischer’s approach consists of subtle conceptual analyses and rigorous evaluations of premises and the logical validity of arguments adduced in the free will debate. For instance, he discusses and defends the premise of the fixity of the past against challenges; he shows that the distinction between hard and soft facts may both reveal and conceal something, and that this distinction should be distinguished from the distinction between fixed and nonfixed facts; he points at confusions about the meaning of concepts such as various senses of ‘can’; he reveals logical fallacies such as equivocation and begging-the-question; he uncovers the fallacy of moving from one ‘language game’ to another (warned against by Wittgenstein).

Fischer recognizes that Frankfurt-type examples (which he adduces to make plausible that moral responsibility does not depend on freedom to do otherwise) are contentious and that he offers only a sketch of his theory of moral responsibility without a thorough defense. This may be one of the reasons why Fischer’s distinction between regulative and guidance control does not take away the doubt whether guidance control — in the absence of the possibility to do otherwise — is sufficient to make the agent morally responsible for his actions. The doubt especially applies to his suggestion that guidance control may be sufficient for moral responsibility even if causal determinism is true (causal determinism obtains if the initial state of the world together with the laws of nature entails every truth about what happens in the future).

Suppose Peter murders John, while he has guidance control (he ‘acts from his own suitably reasons-responsive mechanism’) but not regulative control. Not having regulative control means that Peter is not free to do otherwise and, thus, that it is impossible that Peter does not murder John. It is true that Peter acts from his own reasons-responsive mechanism and that he deliberately murders John. However, if causal determinism is true, then not only Peter’s actions but also his guidance control (and ‘every truth’ related to it, for instance, whether and how and with what results he exercises this control) are entirely determined by factors outside of him. The conditions sufficient for the necessary outcome of his deliberation and choice were already in place long before he even existed. As Fischer recognizes, the fixity of the past means that “the past is like the dog’s tail, and it is the tail that wags the dog”, not the other way round. Therefore, guidance control seems insufficient for rescuing moral responsibility, if the latter requires at least a minimum of self-determination. It seems inappropriate to blame somebody and hold him morally responsible for something entirely caused by external factors, which he, despite his guidance control, could not possibly influence, change or remove.

It is true that the unavoidability with respect to causal determinism differs from the unavoidability with respect to divine foreknowledge, insofar as God’s foreknowledge is not conceptualized as bringing about human action. However, as Fischer points out, it is questionable whether this difference makes a difference. Besides, Fischer admits that his ‘bootstrapping’ argument (which detaches God’s foreknowledge from causal determinism) is controversial. If we take into account these uncertainties, the conclusion seems justified that, if we are not free to do otherwise, it is implausible that divine foreknowledge and causal determinism are compatible with human moral responsibility.

Kane refers to Milton’s Paradise Lost, in which the angels, debating their freedom in the light of God’s foreknowledge, were lost in “endless mazes”. As he notices, this is “not a comforting thought for us mortals.” Fischer does not pose the question whether human beings are sufficiently capable of understanding the relationship between an omniscient God and human freedom, but he recognizes that every major view about God’s knowledge of the future “has at least a mystery associated with it, if not a significant problem.” This may mean that the problems under consideration are irresolvable, even in principle, due to a fundamental incompleteness of human knowledge with respect to the relation between God and man.