Our Knowledge of the Past: A Philosophy of Historiography

Placeholder book cover

Tucker, Aviezer, Our Knowledge of the Past: A Philosophy of Historiography, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 291pp, $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521834155.

Reviewed by John H. Zammito, Rice University


According to Aviezer Tucker, modern historiography is “scientific,” and Bayesian probability theory explains why. He offers a complex, powerful and welcome addition to the philosophical consideration of historical practice. Three points stand out: first, his careful elucidation of what it means to invoke the consensus of a disciplinary community as a warrant for knowledge (ch. 1); second, his historical account of the emergence and consolidation of a paradigm for historical practice, identified with Ranke, which links this decisively not only with its predecessor disciplines but also with its most significant successor, evolutionary biology (ch. 2); and, finally, the Bayesian explication of the “normal science” component in historical practice, what Tucker calls “scientific historiography” (ch. 3). Less compelling, in my view, are his account of historical disagreement (ch. 4) and his discussion of the limits of historical knowledge (chs. 5-6).

A science, for Tucker, is progressive, i.e., it develops new evidence and new knowledge. This is the case, in his view, for modern historiography. “Through the historical development of historiography the web of historiographic beliefs has expanded and the connections among its units grew complex. By now, new historiography should fit old historiography as well as new evidence” (120). Tucker conceives “science” in only a somewhat post-positivist sense because he still cannot abandon the fact-value dichotomy and he still cannot escape privileging universality as the ultimate talisman of theory. Thus he contrasts the physical sciences favorably with the historical sciences (including evolutionary biology). Post-positivism must, in my view, resolutely dispense with such positivist hangovers. Specifically, I cannot find plausible Tucker’s sharp discrimination of “historiographic knowledge” from “historiographic interpretation” (2; 10-12; 142). For Tucker, interpretation falls under value theory, but “scientific historiography” is entirely cognitive. “Too many philosophies of historiography confuse questions of knowledge with questions of value,” he writes (12). To reduce the former to the latter is surely inadequate, but to hold them totally distinct is an inverse error, the “final dogma” of positivism.

Tucker argues that a disciplinary community may make plausible claims to collective knowledge if three constraints are satisfied: the consensus must be uncoerced, it must involve a large number of participants, and a significantly heterogeneous group must reach a unique common judgment. While the claim to knowledge is contingent and fallible, it nevertheless is the best explanation of the consensus. Once this consensus is achieved, a disciplinary community achieves “normal science” or a paradigm, in Kuhn’s terms. For Tucker, historiography attained this in the early nineteenth century in Germany under the auspices of Ranke. Historiography did not achieve its paradigm autochthonously, however; instead, it adopted a successful paradigm from predecessor inquiries – biblical criticism, classical philology, and comparative linguistics. Tucker makes the important point that evolutionary biology followed historiography in adopting the essential features of this paradigm and deploying them to constitute its own “normal science.” This account strikes me not only as sound but also as dramatically important both for defending the ongoing cogency of disciplinary historical practice and for integrating critically and constructively the epistemologies of historicism and naturalism, which I consider a foremost task for philosophy today.

For Tucker, the essential task of the philosophy of historiography (as distinct from speciously metaphysical “philosophy of history”) is to establish “whether historiography is determined, indeterminate, or underdetermined” (9; see 45; 256ff). His argument is: “Historiographic core theories constrain the possible range of interpretations, but parts of historiography are still underdetermined” (21) -- largely for lack of sufficient evidence (146-7). Hence the discipline entails elements both of determinacy and of underdetermination. Indeterminacy, on the other hand, is simply not a reasonable characterization (258). Tucker has little patience with “historiographic skepticism,” as he characterizes postmodernism’s aesthetic or linguistic reformulations of the epistemology of historical practice. Against the tradition from Hayden White and Roland Barthes through Frank Ankersmit, Tucker insists: “The form or style of historiography do not affect its relation with the evidence, its epistemic status” (92). For Tucker, the proper object of study is the practice of historical inquiry, not its ultimate product, hence historical “textbooks” are irrelevant. His stress on evidence is certainly important, and sophisticated “textualist” theorists like Ankersmit have no interest in dismissing it. But the converse dismissal is unwise. The construction of working historical texts (monographs, articles, review essays) is not irrelevant to the epistemology of history. In minimizing this aspect of practice, Tucker underestimates the arguments not only of philosophers like Raymond Martin, but of astute historiographic theorists like Evans or Elton or Jordanova, who try to explain from the inside what historians do.

The discipline of history is faced with the irretrievable absence of the past. There are only traces in the present which become “evidence” only under a theory. “Explanations of descriptions of events in paradigmatic historiography are … the best explanation of a range of evidence, given background information and theories” (188). Consequently “the actual theories and methods that historians use habitually are about the transmission of information over time, from event to evidence” (21), i.e., “inference from evidence to a common cause” (21). “Historians are interested only in particular types of causal chains, the ones that preserve information” (94), but “the selection of evidence according to its information-preserving qualities is theory-laden” (106); only theory elucidates how evidence shows information-preservation or fidelity. “Historians must use theories to know where to search for relevant evidence, to recognize relevant evidence once they discover it, and to interpret nested evidence to generate the kind of evidence that is useful for them” (95). Thus, “confirmation and explanation require more than historiography and evidence; they require theories that connect historiography with evidence and identify the evidence as such in the first place” (93).

The theoretical core of “scientific historiography” is “inferring the information-causal chains that connect the cause, the alleged source of the information, with its effects, the alleged receptors of the information” (74). The decisive role of Fred Dretske’s information-theory of epistemology is clear in this formulation. Equally central is Tucker’s fervent Bayesianism. Bayesian theory establishes “the degree of probability the evidence confers on the hypothesis,” hence it is central to “warranting claims based on partial evidence” (96). Four times Tucker affirms that Bayesianism “is the best explanation of the actual practices of historians” (96; see 21; 120; 134). Clearly historians do not actually calculate Bayesian probability; presumably it is tacit in their reasoning. That is, even if not quantifiable precisely, the order of magnitude of difference in the probability of separate causes relative to a common cause can be sufficient. Tucker acknowledges: “Historians do not quantify fidelities… Since there is no set of algorithms for evaluating fidelities, historians exclude evidence that does not achieve a threshold of fidelity for whatever reason” (121). Hence the importance of corroborating evidence (114). “Historians .. must bootstrap their evaluations of the fidelity of particular evidence by other evidence” (123). The distrust of an uncorroborated evidential claim is “taught as part of the historiographic guild’s right [sic] of passage” (123).

True, “the immediate, primary, subject matter of historiography is evidence and not events” (18), but only in the sense that without the evidence, the very possibility of description of events vanishes. A better starting point is Tucker’s statement that his philosophy of historiography divides matters “into evidence, hypotheses, and theories about the transmission of information from events to evidence” (240). The theories which raise historical practice to “scientific” status concern the transmission of evidence, but the hypotheses which preoccupy historians have to do with the descriptions of events the evidence can warrant.

Tucker contends that philosophy can discriminate in historical practice a “scientific core” but that historical practice is not altogether a normal science. Rather, it is a compound of “normal science, the Rankean paradigm, and traditionalist science” (167). The sorts of questions that can be determinately answered in historiography are not sufficient to address the pragmatic concerns that drive historical inquiry, and therefore historians must supplement “scientific” with “traditional” concerns, develop hypotheses, however tentative or vague, which supplement cognitive with “therapeutic” values. A characteristic feature of this historiographical practice is that it achieves ad hoc accuracy at the expense of theoretical scope. The latter element in historical practice, in his view, accounts for the considerable disagreement among practicing historians.

Tucker holds such conflict of opinions cannot be reduced to “ideological or cultural biases or economic and social interests” (141). Instead, the notion of underdetermination plays the major role in Tucker’s theory of historical practice. “Cognitive values may not be sufficient for discriminating among some historiographic hypotheses, and inconsistent evidence may not disprove some historiographic theories because historians add different ad hoc hypotheses to save them” (146). That is no license for radical incommensurability, or the indeterminacy thesis regarding historical knowledge (179; 258). “Insufficient evidence does not imply that historiography is indeterminate, that anything goes, because the evidence may still be sufficient for eliminating many improbable hypotheses, while conferring equal probability on several competing underdetermined historiographic hypotheses” (142). Thus, “once the requirements of the cognitive values are satisfied, there is ample space for personal interpretations, value judgments, and expositions of value-laden meaning and significance” (42). Here is where, according to Tucker, historical practice supplements “knowledge” with “interpretation.”

Faced with underdetermination, historians split into schools constituted by interests and affiliations which are extra-scientific, and “the subsequent academic politics of interschool rivalry leads historians to deny, suppress, or misrepresent the social and semantic fragmentation in historiography” (168), which is in fact “criss-crossed by divisions between vertical school-theories and horizontal subfields” (169). Tucker asks whether this “traditionalist,” underdetermined dimension of historiography can ever be rendered “scientific,” i.e., included in “normal science,” so that historical practice might more closely approximate the physical sciences. He examines the attempts of comparative history to develop “a historiography that can determine accurate theories of broad scope without an increase in complexity by broadening the evidential base to include information-preserving effects of similar processes that originated across historical space and time” (153). He concludes, pessimistically, that its “difficulties … demonstrates [sic] the entrenched reasons for historiographic underdetermination” (153). For Tucker, “unique hypotheses limit the scope of scientific historiography because they cannot form together a theory of history that would connect disparate confirmed hypotheses of limited scope to form a large scope simple theory of social change” (261). But it is not clear that the discipline of history is after a “general theory of social change” (164). In fact, Tucker recognizes that “most practicing historians are not grand theoreticians. They confront a limited range of evidence and attempt to explain it while being inspired in their precise ad hoc modeling by their interpretation of a vague theoretical background” (163-4) drawn largely from philosophy and social science.

Tucker makes two important and overlapping distinctions between historical practice and the natural sciences. First, in natural science, “evidence is idealized to fit the theory” – he calls this “standardization”-- whereas in historical practice, “theories … are modified ad hoc to fit particular evidence” (21; see 164). Second, Tucker distinguishes the pursuit of a common cause type from the pursuit of a common cause token (101). He writes:

The sciences are divided neither into human sciences and natural sciences according to their subject matters, nor into ideographic [sic] and nomothetic sciences according to the purpose of their inquiries, but between sciences that examine the similar effects of common tokens of causes that preserve information about their common causes and sciences that examine the similar effects of shared types of causes. (260)

What both these overlapping distinctions indicate is that there is something distinctive, after all, to the concern with concrete individuals (“tokens”) – not only in historical practice, but in all the allied pursuits, including evolutionary biology in the natural sciences. What needs to be captured in the latter fields is not some universal generalization but rather the concrete instance or path (event or process). Of course, no concept can ever express fully a concrete particular; nor can there ever be a complete description: all scientists “describe and explain only aspects of events that fit their theories” (242).

Still, in appraising the fit of evidence with theory, historical practice “is not substantially different from biology, geology, or physics” (8). A “colligatory concept” in historiography is not epistemologically different from a theoretical term in physical science: “There is no difference between the use of such theoretical concepts to explain evidence and the use scientists make of theoretical, unobservable concepts to explain a range of evidence… Neither the atom nor the Renaissance are directly observable; they are extremely useful and well-confirmed theoretical concepts” (138). Thus, “another advantage of the Bayesian interpretation of historiography is the elimination of apparent historiographic anomalies when compared to science” (137). In keeping with the Quinean formulation that “historiography, as a science, is holistic, it presents a net of beliefs, connected to evidence at its rims” (120), Tucker argues that in historical inquiry epistemological confidence does not translate directly into any ontological fixity. Tucker argues there is no epistemological difference (i.e., relative to evidence) between ontological realism and constructionism in scientific historiography: “determined constructionism … fits determined historiography as evidence just as well as a realist interpretation” (257). Where constructionism seems more persuasive than realism is in the not-insignificant domain of underdetermined historiography.

One final, admittedly irascible point: Tucker acknowledges that “the philosophy of historiography must rely on the cognitive values and theories of historiography to discover the historical emergence of the conditions of historiographic knowledge, the self-same cognitive values and theories” (47), yet Tucker nonetheless believes philosophers are able to theorize more clearly what historians are about than historians themselves. To whom is “philosophy of historiography” addressed, I wonder, and why? Philosophers often express impatience with historians for not being interested in their treatments of history. They complain that “historians who deny the use of theory are unaware of the theoretical underpinnings of their own practices” (83). To call historical practice scientific “is not to imply that all historians who have practiced successfully the critical method have understood the theoretical foundations for their methods” (83). “It is possible to use a method with confidence both following an understanding of the theory behind it, and because it has worked thus far” (83). This second, guild-practice model is distasteful to Tucker: the contention that historiography might be an art to be learned by a prolonged apprenticeship rather than through theoretical inculcation he dismisses as “esotericism” (19). Since “the professional self-consciousness of historians … is often false,” philosophy must always ask “what historians or scientists are doing, not what they think they are doing,” lest the “meek acceptance of historiographic self-consciousness” make the practice appear “more rational and coherent that it actually is.” Philosophy undertakes not a “phenomenology of disciplinary practitioners,” but a description of “what [the discipline is] actually like.” (4-5) Actual historiographical disputes often fail to satisfy the rigorous requirements for competing explanations (192). “Historians do not realize that their opponents explain a different topic and use different comparison situations” (194). With so much that we don’t understand about what we are doing, how fortunate for us that we have philosophers to make it all clear!