Our Stories: Essays on Life, Death, and Free Will

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John Martin Fischer, Our Stories: Essays on Life, Death, and Free Will, Oxford UP, 2009, 184pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195374957.

Reviewed by David Hodgson, Supreme Court of New South Wales



John Martin Fischer is a highly respected philosopher who has published widely on philosophical topics, particularly in the area of free will and responsibility. Our Stories is a collection of ten essays published between 1986 and 2006, seven by Fischer alone and three with a co-author, introduced by a newly-written Introduction. The first four essays concern the badness of death, the next three take up the possible goodness of immortality, and the last three focus on the way stories and free will give meaning to our lives. The Introduction gives an overview of the essays, and then offers some additional ruminations on these themes.

In the first essay, “Why Is Death Bad?” (1986), Fischer and co-author Anthony L. Brueckner discuss how death, considered as an experiential blank, can be a bad thing for an individual. They note a plausible explanation, developed by Thomas Nagel, that death is a deprivation of the good things of life, and go on to consider a contrary view, from Epicurus and Lucretius, based on our failure to regret not existing prior to birth. This leads to careful consideration of justifications for regarding pre-natal and posthumous non-existence asymmetrically, in particular the point that we care about the future in a way that we don’t care about the past.

These themes are addressed further in the following three essays. “Death, Badness, and the Impossibility of Experience” (1997) pursues the idea that something can be bad for an individual even if the individual never experiences it as bad, and indeed even if it were impossible for the individual to experience it as bad. “Death and the Psychological Conception of Personal Identity” (2000, with co-author Daniel Speak) discusses arguments that justify asymmetry in our attitudes to pre-natal and posthumous non-existence on the basis that a person could not both have substantially earlier birth and yet still be substantially the same person. “Earlier Birth and Later Death: Symmetry Through Thick and Thin” (2006) develops these arguments and also returns to the consideration that we reasonably care about future pleasures in a way that we don’t care about past pleasures.

The fifth essay, “Why Immortality Is Not So Bad” (1994), examines an argument of Bernard Williams to the effect that immortality is necessarily undesirable because there “is no desirable or significant property which life would have more of, or have more unqualifiedly, if we lasted for ever.”1 Against this, Fischer contends that there are pleasures that are not self-exhausting but are repeatable, that given an appropriate distribution of such pleasures endless life would not necessarily become boring, and that one’s character could develop significantly over an endless life without destroying personal identity. An associated essay, “Philosophical Models of Immortality in Science Fiction” (1996, with co-author Ruth Curl), considers various types of immortality postulated in works of science fiction.

“Epicureanism About Death and Immortality” (2006) responds to arguments of Martha Nussbaum concerning death and immortality. In this essay, Fischer again takes up and considers in depth the theme that something can be a bad thing for a person even if the person never experiences it as bad, and discusses the Lucretian idea of life as a banquet, having “a structure in time that reaches a natural and appropriate termination.”2 Fischer argues to the effect that finitude is not essential for life to have a meaningful structure.

The final three essays address the topic of stories, and in particular the part they play in ethical reasoning and in giving meaning to life.

“Stories” (1996) considers the role in ethical reasoning of hypothetical and ‘streamlined’ examples, such as the trolley problem, and considers in particular the criticism that these examples are not realistic, being both artificial and lacking in detail. Fischer identifies three aspects of ethical reasoning, namely recognising what is morally salient in a situation, responding appropriately to what is morally salient, and analysing one’s reasoning in terms of general principles; he suggests that streamlined examples are particularly useful in the third of these aspects.

In “Free Will, Death, and Immortality: The Role of Narrative” (2005), Fischer recalls a view he has advanced in previous publications, that the value of free will lies not in ‘making a difference’ but rather in ‘making a statement’, so that exercises of free will are seen as sentences in the stories of our lives. Fischer argues that “the value of our lives as free creatures is indeed a species of the value of artistic self-expression” (p. 146). He discusses arguments of David Velleman that the overall value of our lives is not just the total amount of momentary well-being in our lives, but also and especially the value of the narrative structure of our lives, and that this in turn depends in part on their success as narrative explanations that can resonate emotionally with an audience.

The final essay, “Stories and the Meaning of Life” (2006), develops the notion that the value of acting freely and responsibly is the value of a distinctive kind of self-expression. Fischer begins by providing a sketch of a theoretical framework for free will and moral responsibility that he has formulated in previous publications, involving what he calls guidance control (having the elements of ‘mechanism ownership’ and ‘reasons-responsiveness’) but not freedom to do otherwise. He pursues the idea that when one acts freely one is engaging in artistic activity, but he maintains that a life, considered as a product of artistic self expression, can be evaluated along different dimensions and that the primary modes of evaluation of our lives are prudential and moral rather than aesthetic.

The book begins with the newly written Introduction, in which an overview of the essays is followed by additional thoughts on continuity and on self-expression. Fischer invokes the notion of continuity as supporting both the badness of death and the possible goodness of immortality. As injury to an individual increases, so does the degree of harm, so it would be surprising if increasing injury to the point of death would bring it about that there is no harm at all. Further, finite moderate extensions to life are reasonably considered to be beneficial, so again it would be surprising if this suddenly reversed at some stage in finite extensions, or in a transition from long finite life to infinite life.

Fischer then considers how his view of free will as self-expression could illuminate the debate as to whether free will is anchored in Close-Call cases (where reasons do not clearly favour one action over another) or in Clear Cases (where practical reason does clearly favour one action), suggesting that Close-Calls reflect the creative aspect of self-expression, while Clear Cases reflect its aspect of reflective endorsement. He concludes by considering an analogy between his idea of freedom as self-expression and the kind of freedom attributed to God in the Judeo-Christian tradition.

My brief account of Fischer’s lines of argument cannot do justice to the richness of the discussion. The topics of these essays are topics of great interest and perplexity, and Fischer’s consideration of them is careful and penetrating. However, as can be the case in a collection of essays, the book does not develop a clear unifying conception or theme, and there is overlap between some of the essays. Further, the discussions of the discrete topics of the book, while always enlightening and insightful, are sometimes less than complete, tending to focus on and respond to what has been said on particular issues by particular authors.

For example, in relation to the badness of death, I accept of course that it is reasonable to limit the discussion to the badness of death for the individual concerned, considered purely as an experiential blank (that is, eliminating from consideration any badness for loved ones, and any aspect of suffering before death). However, even with that limitation, a full examination of the topic would benefit from discussion of the extent to which our thinking about our own deaths (and indeed about our own future pleasures and pains) is influenced by evolutionary selection — that is, the extent to which we care about these things not because there is rational justification but because it was beneficial to the survival and reproduction of our evolutionary forebears that they care about them. (This point is touched on at p. 74, but I think it deserves elaboration.) Another area worth exploring, I think, concerns our desire for knowledge: we can have some knowledge of what happened before we were born, but we cannot know just how things will turn out after we die, and for many of us that is a matter of considerable regret. Things will be happening to our children, to our grandchildren, and to the world, and maybe the hard problem of consciousness will be solved, but alas, we won’t be there to see it and to know it.

Discussion of the possible goodness of immortality would, I think, for completeness, benefit from greater explanation of the kind or kinds of immortality that are under consideration: is it the immortality of a Christian heaven, or some kind of earthly immortality, or something else altogether? The discussion could then be related to kinds of immortality or greatly extended life spans presently being touted as realistic possibilities, such as through cryogenics and ‘downloading’ minds into computers. These two possibilities are mentioned in passing at pp. 98-99 in the review of science fiction accounts of immortality, but are not elaborated on or linked to the discussion of the possible goodness of immortality.

The other main theme of the book, that the value of acting freely and responsibly is the value of a kind of artistic self-expression, is closely related to the theoretical framework for free will and moral responsibility formulated by Fischer in previous publications, involving guidance control but not freedom to do otherwise. It seems to me that its plausibility depends heavily on the plausibility of that framework. The book does not itself set out to justify this framework, so this review is not the place to embark on a detailed critique of it.

However, one support for this framework which is discussed in the book comes from Harry Frankfurt’s argument that free will and responsibility do not require freedom to do otherwise (and are thus compatible with strict determinism), based on so-called Frankfurt cases — that is, scenarios where we would regard a person as exercising free will and being responsible, even though the person could not have done otherwise because something had been devised to ensure that, if the person attempted to do otherwise, he or she would be prevented from doing otherwise. So long as the person does not attempt to do otherwise, the fail-safe device does not operate, and nothing interferes with the person’s freedom.

My own view is that these scenarios are less compelling than they are sometimes supposed to be. I think they feed on an intuition that, but for the fail-safe device, the person could have done otherwise, and even with it, could have attempted to do otherwise; by contrast, if strict determinism is true, it is as if our actions are wholly determined by fail-safe devices installed by genes and environment, with no contribution from anything that is not itself such a fail-safe device. Of course, questions concerning Frankfurt cases and compatibilism in general are large questions to which I cannot do justice here, but the point I make is that the persuasiveness of Fischer’s view of life as artistic self-expression is closely tied to the persuasiveness of his general compatibilist approach. If one adopts a view that we are free and responsible in a way that is incompatible with determinism, and can ‘make a difference’, then the moral dimension of our lives can have a more prominent role than Fischer gives it.3

These are minor reservations. On the back cover of the book, George Graham of Georgia State University comments that "Our Stories offers the reader a probing and insightful inspection by a sophisticated and widely respected philosopher of some of the most vexing questions of human existence"; I concur in this assessment.

1 Bernard Williams, Problems of the Self (Cambridge University Press, 1973), p. 89.

2 Martha Nussbaum, The Therapy of Desire (Princeton University Press, 1994), p. 203.

3 I have attempted to support such an account in various writings, for example in an essay available at <http://users.tpg.com.au/raeda/website/why.htm> and published in Times Literary Supplement on 6 July 2007.