Out of This World: Deleuze and the Philosophy of Creation

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Peter Hallward, Out of This World: Deleuze and the Philosophy of Creation, Verso, 2006, 199pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781844675555.

Reviewed by John Protevi, Louisiana State University


It's the sign of the maturation of philosophical work on Deleuze that Peter Hallward's fine new book has appeared. For while the already quite lengthy series of introductions and reading guides has served its purpose, it's not by approbation alone that one learns to appreciate a thinker; it's also via those who, like Hallward, take the time to carefully point out what they think are the errors, or perhaps better in this case, the limitations of a thinker.[1] I do not agree with Hallward on the details of his argument, but his attempt does what Deleuze claims all good philosophy does: it forces you to think. In trying to understand how Hallward constructs his case I was forced to go back to Deleuze with a fresh eye. This forcing to think is the mark of a fine work, and for that and for other virtues -- its wide range of topics, copious notes and clear writing chief among them -- Hallward's book deserves praise and careful reading.

The first of the critical works on Deleuze was Alain Badiou's Deleuze: « La clameur de l'Etre » (Hachette, 1997; English translation by Louise Burchill as Deleuze: The Clamor of Being [Minnesota, 2000]). Badiou made two decisive moves, each of which disrupted the dominant perception of Deleuze in the Anglophone world. First, he concentrated on the Deleuze of Difference and Repetition and Logic of Sense (the books of the late 1960s in which Deleuze first "spoke in his own voice" after his series of historical works), completely ignoring the works by which Deleuze is best known, the collaborative works with Félix Guattari, Anti-Oedipus and A Thousand Plateaus. Badiou's move was no mere personal preference, but was based on his second remarkable point, his claim -- again contrary to the dominant perception -- that Deleuze is not so much a philosopher of the multiple as of the One. Whence the book's subtitle, which refers to Deleuze's reading of the tradition of univocity in metaphysics: "A single and same voice for the whole thousand-voiced multiple, a single and same Ocean for all the drops, a single clamour of Being for all beings" (Difference and Repetition, 389F / 304E; cited by Badiou at 20F / 11E).

Badiou's lead in isolating a singular logic in Deleuze was taken up in, shall we say, exuberant fashion by Slavov Žižek in Organs without Bodies: On Deleuze and Consequences (Routledge, 2003). Although a good bit of Žižek's book consists of his own speculations on film, politics, quantum mechanics, cognitive science, and several other topics, the parts that do concentrate on Deleuze conduct a polemic in favor of a Deleuzean logic of Being characterized as an "immaterial affect generated by interacting bodies as a sterile surface of pure Becoming" (as in Logic of Sense) and against a characterization of Deleuze as upholding the production of bodies as actualization of virtuality (as in Anti-Oedipus) (Žižek, 21-22).

Insofar as Hallward is the Anglophone world's leading interpreter of Badiou -- Hallward's book, Badiou: A Subject to Truth (Minnesota, 2003), is the standard reference in the field, and will remain so for the foreseeable future -- it should come as no surprise then that Hallward's Deleuze book also follows the inspiration of Badiou in focusing on what is said to be the singular logic of Being that resides beneath Deleuze's multiple interests and vocabularies. Hallward, however, clearly distinguishes himself from Badiou's reading of Deleuze in two ways.

On a formal level, Hallward distinguishes himself from both Badiou and Žižek in accepting what we could call the "continuity thesis" regarding Deleuze's output (87). That is to say, he accepts the works written with Guattari as continuing the project Deleuze began in Difference and Repetition and Logic of Sense. We should note that although it's unclear what Badiou thinks about the continuity thesis, it's clear where Žižek stands. While Badiou merely ignores the works with Guattari, save for the briefest of mentions (Badiou, 13F / 5E), Žižek disdains the collaborative works, calling Anti-Oedipus "arguably Deleuze's worst book" (Žižek, 21).

The content of Hallward's departure from Badiou is both more subtle and more important. In Hallward's characterization, Badiou tries mightily to distinguish himself from Deleuze, painting him as a "poet of a living cosmos" (86) who nonetheless establishes a philosophy that is "indistinguishable from a philosophy of death"; in this, Badiou "goes perhaps a little too far" (177n37). For Hallward, by contrast, Deleuze and Badiou are similar in both upholding a "subtractive" ontology (81); the difference comes in that Deleuze's singular logic of Being can be seen as analogous to the tradition of theophantic thinkers, whereby the divine spark of creation is entombed in creatures; the task of the creature is to redeem that divine spark from its creatural prison (4; 57; 85). But this redemption is not annihilation; Deleuze's philosophy is not that of Lacanian-Žižekian "renunciation-extinction" (94).

In support of his thesis, Hallward's book has a two-fold structure that follows what he claims is the way reality folds for Deleuze along the line of the virtual / actual distinction. In the first three chapters he follows the creative virtual spark into the actual, into creatural "confinement." The book then pivots, and the last three chapters follow the arc of Hallward's reading of Deleuze's term "counter-effectuation": the move away from actual creatural confinement back to the virtual. Although counter-effectuation -- or the "extraction of the event" -- is not an annihilation of the creature, it is a "redemptive" move, Hallward claims, taking us "out of this world," as the book's title would have it. Deleuze seeks always, Hallward writes, "to subtract the dynamics of creation from the mediation of the created"; in this way, Deleuze supposedly seeks to show that "purely creative processes can only take place in a wholly virtual dimension" (3).  Provocatively, Hallward adds, "Deleuze is most appropriately read as a spiritual, redemptive or subtractive thinker … Deleuze's philosophy is oriented by lines of flight that lead out of the world; though not other-worldly, it is extra-worldly" (3; emphasis in original).

Once again, Hallward is careful not to paint Deleuze as desiring the annihilation of the creature (4; 84-87) but rather its "self-transcendence," so that it may become "an adequate vehicle for the creating which sustains and transforms it" (6). This is done most purely in philosophical thought, where action and creation are one insofar as thought creates its own objects of thought. In such "abstract, immediate or dematerialized thought" (3-4), the creature is evacuated to let the creating work through it. In this way Deleuze "affirms the creative telos of thought in terms that invite comparison with what Spinoza called the 'intellectual love of God.' The subject of such thought or love is nothing other than infinite creativity or God himself, insofar as he thinks and loves through us" (2). (We will return to Hallward's use of the phrase "invite comparison with" and other similar rhetorical strategies, which closely associate while still distinguishing Deleuze from the theophantic tradition -- e.g., p. 5: "you are only really an individual if God (or something like God) makes you so".)

In Chapter 1, Hallward leads the reader on a tour of six important Deleuzean ontological concepts: univocity; intuition; continuity; intensity; quantitative hierarchy; and virtuality. By and large the first chapter is unobjectionable in terms of content. However, there are instances when his method of explicating Deleuze by means of the concepts Deleuze adopts from Spinoza and Bergson involve Hallward in the questionable rhetorical strategy of associating Deleuze with the theophantic tradition, all the while maintaining plausible deniability in not coming right out and saying it. The most obvious is his insistence on discussing Spinoza's substance in terms of God (9; see also 87). But as we all know Spinoza's most famous phrase was Deus sive Natura. Given that for Deleuze atheism is "the philosopher's serenity and philosophy's achievement" -- and noting also his naming of the "atheist Spinoza" (What is Philosophy? 89F / 92E) -- we can ask why Hallward did not discuss Deleuze's love of Spinoza as indicating the former's naturalism.

Hallward's reading method must also be mentioned, in which he piles up citations of other authors or of Deleuze's readings of other authors that again serve an associative function. I will concentrate on only one example, but others could be adduced. In the discussion of univocity in Chapter 1, Hallward cites Deleuze's praise of Spinoza as one who "fully accepts the truly philosophical 'danger' of immanence and pantheism implicit in the notion of [univocal] expression. Indeed he throws in his lot with that danger" (9-10). So far, so good: an accurate quotation of Deleuze. But then Hallward adds "-- as does Deleuze after him" (10), implying that Deleuze accepts the 'danger' of pantheism along with that of immanence. To support this provocation, Hallward writes that Deleuze "certainly annuls the difference between God and the world but he does this in favor of God, not world" (10). This is an astonishing claim, which Hallward immediately qualifies: "More precisely, what he annuls is rather the world's own capacity to negate God, to say no to God, to hold God at a critical or interpretative distance from itself" (10). The term "negate" should raise our suspicion. It's certainly no secret that Deleuze consistently denies that negation is primary, but he never "annuls" the "capacity" to negate: he criticizes the use of negation in the realm of ethics and he denies the primacy of negation in the realm of ontology. We then see what is perhaps the most egregious instance of Hallward's "theologizing" rhetoric, one I cannot help but think he does impishly, poking a bit of fun at Deleuze: "Here again he [Deleuze] follows Spinoza's lead, at least insofar as Spinoza can be read as a philosopher who refuses to 'distinguish God from the world' and who thus 'maintains that there is no such thing as what is known as the world,' that left to itself 'the world has no true reality'" (10). The quotations, of course, come from Hegel, for whom Deleuze rarely concealed his disdain! It's the "at least insofar as" that indicates Hallward's maintenance of plausible deniability, all the while associating Deleuze with a theological or at least theophantic position that is at least tendentious. But rather than waxing indignant here, I also can't help but think that Deleuze would have chuckled at Hallward's audacity, or rather, at the twinkle we can imagine in Hallward's eye as he wrote those lines.

In Chapter 2, Hallward discusses the relation of actual creatures and virtual creations. Here he commits what is to me his crucial error, which colors all the subsequent analyses of his book: he creates a dualism between virtual and actual, denying the intensive its own ontological register. In many passages, Hallward associates intensity with the virtual, in opposition to the actual: "Differentiatings or creatings are virtual, and are intensive rather than extensive" (27; emphasis in original). As he continues on 28, "The crucial point is that all of the productive, differential or creative force in this dual configuration stems from the virtual creating alone, and not from the actual creature" (my emphasis). Later he is blunt: "We know that the essential dualism in this philosophy of creation is that between actual and virtual" (82; my emphasis).

The relations among actual, virtual and intensive form the most important issue in explicating Deleuze's ontology. I would argue that we should consider the intensive as an independent ontological register, one that mediates the virtual and actual, which are its limits. Even if one doesn't accept this and insists on a dualism of virtual and actual, one would have to say that the intensive belongs with the actual. Intensive morphogenetic processes exist here on earth, they are things of this world; they are not "out of this world," as Hallward would have it by locating them exclusively in the virtual. In terms of Deleuze's writings on the existence of the intensive, it's vital to recall that the primary referent for intensity in Difference and Repetition is the "spatio-temporal dynamisms" of Chapter 5, the "Asymmetrical Synthesis of the Sensible", not the virtual Ideas of Chapter 4, the "Ideal Synthesis of Difference."

Hallward's positing of a dualism in Deleuze cannot be sustained, in my opinion. For instance, throughout Difference and Repetition Deleuze uses the term "individual" to refer to the process of individuation, or perhaps to that which is undergoing individuation, rather than to the finished product, which in the human realm would be the person. Thus the person is the set of fixed habits, the actual; the intensive is the register of "impersonal individuations"; and beneath these individuations we find the virtual as the register of "pre-individual singularities" (as well as differential elements and relations) (Difference and Repetition 355F / 277E). I would argue here that Deleuze is positing three ontological registers: the actual (person), the intensive (impersonal individuation), and the virtual (pre-individual singularities); again, however, even if one does not accept the intensive as its own ontological register, the important point is that it must somehow be distinguished from the virtual, rather than identified with it, as Hallward would have it.

Spatio-temporal dynamisms, that is, morphogenetic processes exhibiting intensive properties, are processes of individuation, of emergence from pre-individual fields. The paradigm cases for Deleuze are embryos and weather systems. In the biological register, the "field" of individuation (the gradients of which are laden with pre-individual singularities) is the egg, while the process of individuation is embryonic morphogenesis; in the meteorological register, the field of individuation is the pre-conditions (the bands of different temperature and pressure in air and water) to the formation of wind currents or storms, which are the spatio-temporal dynamisms. But Hallward's identification of the virtual and the intensive (e.g., p. 40, where he puts "virtual or intensive quantities" as synonyms) presents many problems. For when Hallward discusses weather systems as "intensive assemblages" (38) and then goes on to talk about the "virtual process of individuation" (47), he is asking us to consider weather systems as virtual. But that can't be: any resident of Louisiana will be able to locate hurricanes for you in terms of their spatio-temporal co-ordinates. To be fair, we do have to distinguish between the location of a hurricane as embedded in a geographic co-ordinate system -- its extensive properties -- and the thresholds proper to its intensive properties. It's only at certain singular points in the differential relations among air and water temperature and wind currents that thunderstorms, tropical depressions, tropical storms, and hurricanes form. Nonetheless, the point is that the weather system itself is the intensive process by which those singularities are actualized, and that this intensive process operates here, in this world.

In sum, whereas I argue that the intensive deserves to be treated as a distinct ontological register, Hallward moves the intensive into the virtual. He thus empties all creativity out of the actual and thereby claims that the virtual somehow does this creative work itself: a cosmic Life that experiments with itself in the virtual and then expresses itself in the actual. I would argue that it is better to say that actual organisms (things with fixed patterns) might be that which "life sets against itself in order to limit itself" (in the words of A Thousand Plateaus 628F / 503E), but embryos are that by which life experiments, and that embryonic experimentation qua intensive process is a thing of this world.

Not only does Hallward posit a dualism of virtual and actual, he orients it exclusively in favor of the virtual, as when he writes of the "unqualified dependence of the actual upon the virtual" (47). A key problem for him thus arises when he writes that "everywhere he [Deleuze] looks he finds evidence to prove that virtual or differential 'individuation always governs actualization'" (47; citing Difference and Repetition 323F / 251E). We have claimed that identifying individuations or spatio-temporal dynamisms as "virtual or differential" misses the point, as they are worldly intensive processes; no one should think that embryos are virtual. But let us now discuss the relation of the virtual and the intensive (or, if one insists on a dualism, on the intensive portion of the actual, the actual qua intensive). I would claim that intensive processes of individuation mediate the virtual and the actual, a point Hallward denies. He writes, "virtual creatings immediately give rise to actual creatures" (35). Unfortunately, Hallward is then forced to contradict himself in quoting Deleuze on this point: "the creative 'movement goes … from the virtual to its actualization -- through the intermediary of a determining individuation'" (48; citing Difference and Repetition 324F / 251E). Here it's clear that Deleuze holds that spatio-temporal dynamisms are exactly those "determining individuations," the intensive processes of which mediate virtual and actual.

The main discussion of the primacy of individuation over actualization and differenciation occurs at Difference and Repetition 314-327F / 244-254E.  We have to recall here the "order of reasons" given at 323F / 251E: differentiation -- individuation -- dramatization -- differenciation. Spatio-temporal dynamisms are intensive processes of individuation and it is these processes which create lines of differenciation: the latter are by no means predetermined by Ideas [differentiation]. It's precisely the idiosyncratic differences of pre-individual fields (Difference and Repetition 324F / 252E: "no two eggs or grains of wheat are identical") and the singular character of the intensive spatio-temporal dynamisms which operate therein that determine the species and qualities of things.

Let's call the move from intensity to dramatization and differenciation the "down-relation". My question is about the "up-relation," that is, the relation between individuation and differentiation. Hallward denies there is such an "up-relation." The picture is more complicated in Deleuze, who says that "individuation is the act by which intensity determines the differential relations to become actualized, along the lines of differenciation and within the qualities and extensities it creates" (317F / 246E: "L'individuation, c'est l'acte de l'intensité qui détermine les rapports différentiels à s'actualiser, d'apres des lignes de differenciation, dans les qualities et les étendues qu'elle crée"). Writing a few pages later about the clear and confused nature of intensities, Deleuze tells us that the expression of Ideas in intensities "introduces a new type of distinction into these relations and between Ideas a new type of distinction" (i.e., from co-existing to relations of simultaneity or succession). He then writes that "all the intensities are implicated in one another, each in turn both enveloped and enveloping, such that each continues to express the changing totality of Ideas, the variable ensemble of differential relations." He concludes that "each intensity clearly expresses only certain relations or certain degrees of variation … those on which it is focused when it has the enveloping role" (Difference and Repetition 325 F / 252E).

My question to Hallward: is there a way in which the selective "focus" by which intensities clearly express only certain relations will itself introduce changes into the realm of Ideas? That is, can one say that experimentation with intensive morphogenetic processes will link together new combinations of differential relations, thereby forming new Ideas? That's what I take "determines the differential relations to be actualized" (which I prefer as a translation of "à s'actualiser") to mean in the extreme case of an Event or "emission of singularities": it renders them determinate in the sense of linking together previously unrelated relations. In pushing this interpretation, I want to avoid a Platonism in which the Ideas are already determined and so expression is a mere copying of already made linkages of relations. And it is to just such a Platonism that I fear Hallward's denial of the "up-relation" leads us.

If an Idea is a set of differential relations, that is, linked rates of change, then the Idea of color is the linkage of rates of change of electromagnetic vibrations, and colors are actualized by eyes / brains / bodies which express certain of those relations. It is arguable that the eye / brain / body of different animals express different relations; they enact a different visual world (to use the terminology first established in Francisco Varela, Evan Thompson and Eleanor Rosch's The Embodied Mind [MIT, 1991]; see also Evan Thompson, "Colour vision, evolution, and perceptual content," Synthese 104 (1995): 1-32). These different visual worlds were not waiting in the virtual realm to be actualized: the eye / brain / body of the animals have to do the creative work to produce different enacted visual worlds. And that creation has to take place in the long-term intensive processes of evolution as linked to those short-term intensive processes of development, as detailed in several schools of contemporary biology, evolutionary developmental biology ("evo-devo") and Developmental Systems Theory ("DST") among them.

However, Hallward cannot appreciate the role of intensive processes as creative of biological novelty because he assimilates a genetic reductionism to his exclusive privilege of the virtual and evacuation of all creativity from the actual. He writes that "there is no more an interactive relation between this virtual or composing power and its actual or composed result than there is between a given set of genes and the organism that incarnates them (52; emphasis in original). But precious few biologists today would accept the hard-core genetic reductionism by which organisms "incarnate" genes. While we cannot enter into the critiques of genetic reductionism offered by the advocates of DST (inter alia, Richard Lewontin, Susan Oyama, Paul Griffiths), we can at least refer in admiration to the great riches of Mary Jane West-Eberhard's Developmental Plasticity and Evolution (Oxford, 2003), and in particular to her concept of environmental induction of novel traits as a source of evolutionary potential (145; 499ff). While Deleuze's biophilosophy has been the subject of several noteworthy works (Keith Ansell Pearson, Germinal Life [Routledge, 1999]; Mark Hansen, "Becoming as Creative Involution? Contextualizing Deleuze and Guattari's Biophilosophy," Postmodern Culture 11.1), his relation to evo-devo and DST is relatively under-appreciated.[2] So while we cannot present a full-fledged argument here, we should recall that Deleuze himself includes a critique of genetic reductionism in Difference and Repetition, precisely by alluding to the spatio-temporal dynamism or intensive morphogenetic processes at the cellular level that mediate virtual [genes] and actual [organism]: "The nucleus and the genes designate only the differentiated matter -- in other words, the differential relations which constitute the pre-individual field to be actualized; but their actualization is determined only by the cytoplasm, with its gradients and fields of individuation" (323F / 251E).

These are among the most difficult and controversial points in thinking about Deleuze's ontology and a book review is not the format for a full discussion of the issues. Let me leave the above points as questions for Hallward then and move on to the rest of his book. Hallward's chapter 5 concerns Deleuze's works on art and cinema, and chapter 6 focuses on Deleuze and Guattari's notion of science and philosophy laid out in What is Philosophy? These are fine chapters, covering the main points of the works in question in clear and meaningful terms. Like all of Hallward's work, they deserve careful attention, but it would extend this review too long to discuss them in detail here. So I would like to end by turning to the conclusion, where Hallward treats Deleuze's ethics and politics.

Hallward's dualism and positing of uni-directional virtual dominance prepares him to say that Deleuze's orientation "out of this world" vitiates his politics, leaving it "little more than utopian distraction" (162), one that "inhibits any consequential engagement with the constraints of our actual world" (161). Instead of a supposedly extra-worldly preference for the virtual, Hallward writes -- eloquently and certainly not without justification -- that "the politics of the future are likely to depend less on virtual mobility than on more resilient forms of cohesion, on more principled forms of commitment, on more integrated forms of coordination, on more resistant forms of defense" (162). But it's only Hallward's identification of the intensive and the virtual and consequent evacuation of all creativity from our world that leads him to think that, of his desiderata, "resilient cohesion" and "integrated coordination" are not Deleuzean concepts. I would submit that these are more aligned with what Deleuze and Guattari recommend -- experimentation with intensive processes -- than with either "virtual mobility" or its alleged counterpart, "actual fixity," to which Hallward seems attracted here.

I have insisted enough, I think, on the fact that we live in an intensive rather than (or at least in addition to) an "actual" world, so I will conclude only by saying that Hallward has missed the "toolbox" element of Deleuze's work. (I'm referring here to the well-known conversation between Foucault and Deleuze, "Intellectuals and Power," available in English in D. F. Bouchard, ed., Language, Counter-Memory, Practice [Cornell, 1977]; see 208 for the "toolbox" remark.) In his conclusion, Hallward verges on the polemical, warning us against the futility of reading Deleuze politically. But his reading is theoretical, all-too-theoretical. To examine Deleuzean politics is not so much to read the singular logic of being that allegedly subtends the many analyses of the structures of territorial assemblages, the detailed theory of capitalism and the state, the many pragmatic cautions about experimentation with social interaction found throughout A Thousand Plateaus, but to see how these can be and have been used to find points of transformation and intervention in a system. When Deleuze and Guattari write, "we know nothing about a body until we know what it can do, in other words, what its affects are, how they can or cannot enter into composition with other affects, with the affects of another body" (A Thousand Plateaus 314F / 257E), we have to consider their philosophical writings in this respect. In other words, we have to see how they've been put to use (and there is certainly no "progressive" guarantee here, as Hallward himself notes [163]). So in this regard at least, it's to the positive attempts at "applying" Deleuze and Deleuze & Guattari that we must turn in order to evaluate the potentials for compositional affects offered by these thinkers, rather than to the critical work of Hallward, as noteworthy and thought-provoking as that might be in many other aspects.

[1] This point is also made in Keith Ansell-Pearson's review in NDPR (2007.03.06) of Jay Lampert, Deleuze and Guattari's Philosophy of History (Continuum, 2006).

[2] Technically speaking, West-Eberhard prefers to call her approach "developmental evolutionary biology" rather than "evolutionary developmental biology" (vii).