Outside Color: Perceptual Science and the Puzzle of Color in Philosophy

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M. Chirimuuta, Outside Color: Perceptual Science and the Puzzle of Color in Philosophy, MIT Press, 2015, 245pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262029087.

Reviewed by Jonathan Cohen, University of California, San Diego


This book is a bold attempt to ask philosophical questions about color in new ("outside") ways -- to place "within the frame of history and philosophy of science, topics typically classified as belonging to the philosophy of mind and perception" (214). In addition to its focus on the history and philosophy of science, Outside Color is especially well-informed by recent work in the psychophysics and neuroscience of color vision. M. Chirimuuta is unafraid in urging that empirical currents in these fields motivate overturning philosophical orthodoxy in favor of new and iconoclastic positions, including an "adverbialist" form of color relationalism on which colors qualify perceptual events rather than distal particulars. Below I will sketch the contents of the book's chapters (§1), register skepticism about some of the conclusions Chirimuuta attempts to draw from the color science she reviews (§2), and then move on to a critical examination of her color adverbialism (§3) before concluding (§4).


After a pair of preliminary chapters laying out and historically situating the puzzles that have made color seem especially philosophically problematic, Chirimuuta uses chapter 3 to frame the metaphysical debate about color as a contest between three principal rivals: realism (colors are identical to physical/primitive properties of objects, and we sometimes veridically perceive them; e.g., Byrne and Hilbert (2003), Watkins (2002)), irrealism/antirealism (visual appearances to the contrary notwithstanding, colors are never instantiated; e.g., Hardin (1988)), and relationalism (colors are constituted in terms of relations between perceiving subjects and perceived objects; e.g., Cohen (2009)).

In chapter 4 she summarizes empirical work suggesting that color vision is not best understood as a separate perceptual modality for the assignment of colors to surfaces, but a suite of capacities for extracting wavelength information in the service of visually responding to objects, and consequently contributing to spatial and object representation. She thinks this lesson is damaging to color realism, which in her view construes color perception as extracting its target properties (colors) in a way that is independent of the representation of objects and their non-color properties.

In chapter 5, Chirimuuta urges us to infer our naturalistic color ontology not from the ontological views of color scientists (which don't appear to support any consensus), but from their (presumably more widely shared) commitment to a "pragmatist" epistemology of perception -- one on which perception is action-guiding, and delivers non-unique, partial, and interest-relative descriptions of the world. She thinks both traditional realists and irrealists about color have wrongly taken perception to aspire to a unique, complete, and interest-independent description, only disagreeing about whether this description corresponds to reality (realists) or not (irrealists). She proposes that, by instead accepting her sort of perceptual pragmatism, we can allow for the apparent discrepancies between perceived qualities and the distal world that have been a thorn in the side of traditional color realism without thereby committing ourselves to color irrealism.

In chapter 6 Chirimuuta lays out her adverbial form of color relationalism, which is designed to accommodate better than alternatives the odd, "Janus-faced," inner-cum-outer status that many thinkers have ascribed to color. On this view, colors are neither properties of inner mental states nor properties of distal mind-independent objects. Rather, colors are properties of perceptual events (whence "adverbial"), which events constitutively involve a relation between an inner/psychological and an outer/distal item (whence "relational").

Chapter 7 is devoted to showing how color adverbialism can be coherently combined with (suitably restricted forms of) either representationalist or naive realist accounts of perception, and that it allows for errors of color perception. She argues that adverbialism is compatible with a "complex Fregean" version of representationalism (168-9) on which perception represents colors as "chromatic phenomenal modes of presentation" of the spectral and non-spectral properties of objects (169). But Chirimuuta also urges that her adverbialism is consistent with a version of naive realism on which, when a perceiver is in a genuine perceptual relation, she has epistemic contact with the world not mediated by a representational veil of ideas. What about perceptual error? She denies that there is error in the many "textbook illusion" cases where perceivers fall short of recovery of surface spectral reflectances (e.g., ordinary cases of simultaneous color contrast), and also denies that verbal disagreements about the colors of items reveal that at least one interlocutor misrepresents. But she allows that color perception errs in cases of "ecologically relevant misperception" where we see poorly, or where there is insufficient spectral contrast.

Finally, in chapter 8, Chirimuuta takes on the objection that her adverbialist relationalism is at odds with the data of color phenomenology. She accepts that experience may seem to present colors as outer-directed and situationally stable, rather than (as per her view) inner-cum-outer directed and changing with passing perceptual events. But she argues that this impression comes from (false) theoretical interpretations of experience rather than from experience itself. Specifically, she counters (drawing on her arguments from chapter 4) that experience presents color as "bound up with" (206) objects that are outer and situationally stable, but that it is agnostic about the relationality and stability of colors per se. (As support, she observes that color experience in a Ganzfeld, which is much less obviously directed on outer items, also seems less obviously to present colors as outer, and that color constancy works best in natural scenes involving genuine objects and those reduced stimulus configurations that support object interpretations.)


Chirimuuta is at her best when she is synthesizing large swathes of psychophysical and neuroscientific research on color. She effectively situates individual experimental results within the wider trends they support, and communicates these lessons in vigorous and engaging terms. However, she is sometimes less convincing in her attempts to bring these empirical currents to bear on the ontological disputes she explicitly takes as her targets.

For example, this description applies to her discussion of the functional purposes of color perception in chapter 4. Here Chirimuuta's summary of the interactions between wavelength information and object perception, spatial perception, and other visual features (form, contour, texture) is wide-ranging, convincing, and important. She is to be commended for emphasizing these themes, and for bringing them to the attention of philosophers.[1]  However, it is far less clear that these ideas bear negatively on the prospects     of color realism, as Chirimuuta claims they do (98-99). Color realism is a view about whether colors are real  and instantiated (and, depending on how it is spelled out, perhaps also about what sorts of properties colors are).[2] It is not a view about the functional purpose of color perception, and is not committed to treating colors "in isolation from other stimulus dimensions" (69). A color realist of the sort Chirimuuta targets could happily accept that the processing of color information in the visual system is "bound up with" the representation of objects, spatial organization, form, contour, motion, and all the rest: she would express this point by claiming that representations of the real and instantiated physical/primitive properties she takes to be identical with colors interact with these other sorts of representations in the perceptual psychologies of organisms. Similarly, the realist can agree with Chirimuuta's denial that colors are isolated dimensions: it's entirely consistent with color realism to hold that colors are always (indeed, even nomically or metaphysically necessarily) exemplified in conjunction with, say, spatial and other visually accessible properties. So, contrary to what she says, the important scientific lessons Chirimuuta emphasizes in these sections do not conflict with the ontological views she is concerned to overturn.

I am similarly skeptical about Chirimuuta's conclusions about perceptual pragmatism in chapter 5. First, it's unclear why would-be philosophical naturalists need endorse any consensus philosophical views of color scientists (as opposed to producing views that respect the experimental data): naturalist methodology demands deference to naturalistic evidence and good argument, but not to intellectual popularity as such. For what it's worth, I also believe there is less consensus about Chirimuuta's sort of pragmatism among color scientists than she indicates. More importantly, however, and notwithstanding her claims to the contrary (119, 130), there need be no conflict between the "correspondence" epistemology she finds in traditional forms of color realism and irrealism, on the one hand, and the pragmatism she offers as a replacement, on the other. On the contrary, it appears that the two views on offer amount to two different, and in principle entirely compatible, yardsticks for assessing perceptual states. That one assesses a perceptual state by asking whether it represents the world veridically on some relevant dimension ("whether it corresponds to reality" in some respect) in no way prevents one from asking, additionally, whether the very same state successfully guides action given the needs, interests, and behavioral repertoire of the organism in whom it occurs. But if these two measures of perceptual success are independent, it is hard to see how focusing attention exclusively on one of them (as Chirimuuta urges) could possibly undercut the motivation for forms of color realism/irrealism that presuppose the other.


Chirimuuta's official formulation of color adverbialism says this:

Colors are properties of perceptual interactions involving a perceiver (P) endowed with a spectrally discriminating visual system (V) and a stimulus (S) with spectral contrast of the sort that can be exploited by V (140).[3]

As noted, the principal motivation Chirimuuta offers for this position is her contention that the view acknowledges better than alternatives the sense -- which arguably underlies the oscillation between more subject-involving and more subject-independent color ontologies since at least the seventeenth century -- that colors somehow have both an inner aspect rooted in subjective experience and an outer aspect rooted in the mind-independent makeups of distal objects. Indeed, Chirimuuta counts it a significant benefit of adverbialism that it does not force color into either side of an acknowledged inner-outer dualism, but rather treats colors as qualifying perceptual events that constitutively unite the inner and the outer into monistic wholes (154-155).

Yet color adverbialism faces several objections to which Chirimuuta's answers are not always convincing. Among the most significant of these, it seems to me, are the following.

First, and most obviously, color adverbialism conflicts with the idea (endorsed by more or less every other color ontology, supported by the grammatical structure of color predications in every natural language of which I'm aware, and arguably also by ordinary color phenomenology) that colors qualify individuals rather than events. Chirimuuta mostly stands her ground on this issue, bravely rejecting both contrary philosophical opinion and the (defeasible) grammatical evidence of the world's languages, and insisting that phenomenology (when understood correctly) is agnostic on the matter. On the other hand, she herself accepts an account of visual experience on which phenomenology presents colors as modes of presentation of objects' properties (specifically, of their spectral and non-spectral properties; 167ff), rather than (per her adverbialism) as modifiers of perceptual events. As such, even given Chirimuuta's own understanding, she must say that phenomenology is guilty of a widespread and systematic category error in the way it presents colors.

Second, and pace Chirimuuta (153, fn26; again on 178), color adverbialism is susceptible to the Many Properties problem Frank Jackson (1977) raises against traditional adverbialist accounts of perception. To see this, consider a conjunctive perceptual event e: I perceive both a red triangle and a blue square. Though Chirimuuta never provides a theory of event individuation, it is plausible that e is (also) an event of my perceiving a red triangle. And, equally plausibly, e is (also) an event of my perceiving a blue square. The adverbialist takes colors to qualify events rather than individuals, so will translate these last claims by saying that redness qualifies the event of my perceiving a triangle, and that blueness qualifies the event of my perceiving a square. But, again these "two" perceptual events are just one event e, described two ways; and if redness and blueness qualify e, they qualify it no matter how described. So it follows that blueness qualifies the event of my perceiving a triangle, and that redness qualifies the event of my perceiving a square. Or, retranslating adverbialist glosses into ordinary terms and restoring the conjunction, the view entails that I perceive a blue triangle and a red square. Consequently, Chirimuuta's adverbialism is unable to distinguish perceiving a red triangle and a blue square from perceiving a blue triangle and a red square.[4]

Third, because adverbialism makes colors properties of subject-involving perceptual events, the view predicts, counterintuitively and idealistically, that colors go in and out of existence with these events -- say, when perceivers die, close their eyes, or shift their attention. As Chirimuuta is aware, there are forms of relationalism that avoid this instability by holding that the subject-involving relations that constitute colors are (or are related to) dispositions to affect subjects, which remain in place even when not manifest. Chirimuuta objects that the resulting view is "quite a watered-down version of relationalism, in that colors are not literally perceiver-dependent properties. Even for the classic dispositionalist, perceivers are required for the standing color dispositions to be manifest" (198, fn12).

But this worry is misplaced. Such a relationalist view does make colors literally perceiver-dependent in the ordinary sense that they are constitutively dependent on perceivers, though the dependence in question involves a dispositional relation. Chirimuuta is of course free to find this sense of perceiver-dependence uninterestingly weak, though (contrary to what she suggests) this is exactly the sense of perceiver-dependence enjoyed by the forms of dispositionalism she mentions approvingly: what dispositionalists who treat colors as "standing" dispositions mean by that term is precisely that the dispositions they identify with colors remain in place even when not manifest, e.g., in the absence of perceivers.[5] That this and other "watered-down" relationalist accounts avoid the extreme instability of Chirimuuta's colors is, it seems to me, a prima facie advantage of such views over color adverbialism.

Finally, Chirimuuta's proffered motivation for color adverbialism is unconvincing. Adverbialists, for whom colors qualify perceptual events built from both psychological and non-psychological components, are in no less need of a separate inner and outer realm than are their realist and irrealist competitors. Nor does the adverbialist advance interestingly beyond the "correspondence" problem Chirimuuta hopes to transcend (ch5-6): where others faced the question whether a particular inner and outer item correspond, adverbialists face the structurally similar question whether a particular inner and outer item constitute a genuine perceptual event. In any case, it's not clear why the "dualism" at issue, which simply amounts to marking a distinction between psychologies and non-psychologies, is philosophically objectionable (any more than, say, a view that distinguishes between ducks and non-ducks). Accordingly, I don't see why a theory's capacity to avoid a dualism of this innocuous sort should be counted as a point in its favor.[6]


Though I have emphasized objections to Chirimuuta's views in the foregoing, there is much to recommend in Outside Color for philosophers of perception, mind, and psychology, as well as those interested in the connections between these issues and the history and philosophy of science. It makes a number of bold and original contributions to the philosophical literature on color that will have to be reckoned with in future discussions.


I am grateful to Derek Brown, Craig Callender, Mazviita Chirimuuta, Matthew Fulkerson, and Mohan Matthen for comments on earlier versions of this review.


Akins, Kathleen A. and Hahn, Martin. (2014). More than Mere Colouring: The Role of Spectral Information in Human Vision. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 65 (1):125-171.

Boghossian, Paul A. and Velleman, J. David (1991). Physicalist Theories of Color. The Philosophical Review 100: 67-106.

Byrne, Alex and Hilbert, David R. (2003). Color Realism and Color Science. Behavioral and Brain Sciences 26 (1):3-21.

Cohen, Jonathan (2009). The Red and the Real: An Essay on Color Ontology. Oxford.

Hardin, C. L. (1988). Color for Philosophers: Unweaving the Rainbow. Hackett.

Jackson, Frank (1977). Perception: A Representative Theory. Cambridge University Press.

Watkins, Michael (2002). Rediscovering Colors: A Study in Pollyanna Realism. Dordrecht.

[1] As Chirimuuta acknowledges, Akins and Hahn (2014) stress similar conclusions.

[2] Thus, Byrne and Hilbert (2003) write that, "The problem of color realism is posed by the following two questions. First, do objects like tomatoes, strawberries, and radishes really have the distinctive property that they appear to have? Second, what is this property?" (4).

Similarly, according to Boghossian and Velleman (1991),

The dispute between realists about color and anti-realists is actually a dispute about the nature of color properties. The disputants . . . disagree over whether any of the uncontroversial facts about material objects -- their powers to cause visual experiences, their dispositions to reflect incident light, their atomic makeup, and so on -- amount to their having colors (67).

[3] As Mohan Matthen points out (p. c.), on this formulation, adverbialism does not amount to a sufficient condition for being a color (nor, a fortiori, a definition, pace her characterization of an "essentially equivalent" pair of claims on 142 as definitions). A perceiver of the right sort, with a visual system of the right sort, might have a perceptual interaction with a stimulus of the right sort, such that the interaction has the properties of being pleasurable and lasting three minutes. But being pleasurable and lasting three minutes are not colors.

[4] In conversation, Chirimuuta has suggested that adverbialists can escape this problem by insisting on a technical sense of 'event' involving only single objects -- in effect, stipulating that there can be no conjunctive perceptual events of the sort described in the main text. Of course, to prevent a version of the same worry making reference to different spatial (/temporal) parts of one object, events must be restricted yet further to perceptual interactions with a single target that exemplifies a single color throughout its spatial (/temporal) extent.

But this solution is costly. First, it is ad hoc. Second, it invites questions about other cases: must objects be uniform in their textures, sizes, temperatures, and other properties? Why or why not? Third, it changes the subject: it would prevent adverbialists from explaining the colors we encounter in perceptual interactions with (spatiotemporally non-uniform) ordinary objects, which we presumably began with the hope of understanding. Fourth, it would mean that the account of events on which adverbialism rests itself presupposes a prior understanding of (/way of individuating) colors, and so should be unavailable to adverbialists (who are in the business of providing an ontology of color we don't already have in hand).

[5] As Chirimuuta notes (ch2), it is controversial whether Descartes, Locke, and other moderns often associated with dispositionalism about color think of colors as standing in this sense.

[6] Chirimuuta claims that the distinction between "an objective world of natural facts -- a subject matter of physics, in contrast to the world of human facts and subjective feeling" (33) arises as part of a modern mechanistic reaction to scholastic views about perception and the mind, and that "the separation between what is inside the head and what is out in the world" is a "distinction established in the seventeenth century" (39). Read literally, that strikes me as implausible: it's hard to understand why Aristotle offers separate psychological works (De Anima, De Sensu, De Memoria), featuring importantly different kinds of scientific explanation from those in his more general works, without taking him to be committed to some such contrast. In any case, nothing in Chirimuuta's genealogy offers any reason for believing that a mere distinction between psychologies and non-psychologies is problematic, or that we should prefer views avoiding it.