Outside Ethics

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Raymond Geuss, Outside Ethics, Princeton University Press, 2005, 320pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 069112342X.

Reviewed by Alasdair MacIntyre, University of Notre Dame


No one among contemporary moral and political philosophers writes better essays than Raymond Geuss. His prose is crisp, elegant, and lucid. His arguments are to the point. And, by inviting us to reconsider what we have hitherto taken for granted, he puts in question not just this or that particular philosophical thesis, but some of the larger projects in which we are engaged. Often enough Geuss does this with remarkable economy, provoking us into first making his questions our own and then discovering how difficult it is to answer them.

In so doing he continues and extends some of the enquiries of the Frankfurt School, more especially of Adorno. Three aspects of those enquiries should be kept in mind. They were and are an attempt to free us from the limitations and distortions of the bourgeois cultural and social order inherited from the Enlightenment, so that we may understand the inadequacies of concepts and presuppositions that are taken for granted by and so imprison most of our contemporaries. They posed and pose the painful question of how, if and when we have arrived at such an understanding, we are to live out our everyday lives within a discredited social and cultural order. And their focus was and is on the concrete and the particular, so that generalizations and abstractions, unavoidable as they are, should not obscure the realities that they are designed to disclose. Geuss's enquiries in all three respects resemble Adorno's.

The limitations and distortions which he hopes to overcome and to correct are those of what he takes to be the dominant world-view in contemporary Western societies: a conception of choices and actions as expressions of individual subjective preferences, a conception of the point and purpose of knowledge as deriving from its usefulness in enabling us to predict and control our environment, and a conception of the rules that are to govern our moral and political lives as constraints upon our interactions with others in the form of universal laws or principles about which we would, under certain circumstances, all agree. Those conceptions have been articulated in a number of different ways, among them as the doctrines of contemporary liberalism.

About liberalism Geuss is not entirely negative. He has said elsewhere that "we do not really have any effective general framework for thinking about politics apart from liberalism" (Public Goods, Private Goods, 2001, p. 114) and he identifies strongly with the struggles of an earlier liberalism against theocratic, absolutist, and dogmatic modes of thought. But against the contemporary liberal appeal to rational consensus he argues that it is blind to the multiplicity of conflicts that stand in the way of such consensus and that its normative standpoint prevents those guided by it from recognizing the harsh actualities and historically conditioned possibilities of contemporary politics. He remarks on the fact that the period in the late 1970's and the 1980's when John Rawls's theory of justice became widely influential among academic liberals was one of rising inequality, a downturn in the economy, and a political turning to the right and on the systematic failure of liberals to comprehend why this was so.

Yet the politics that Geuss wishes both to illuminate and to subvert includes much more than liberalism. In three essays on freedom as an ideal, on virtue and the good life, and on happiness and politics he distinguishes carefully a number of different senses and uses of 'freedom', 'virtue', and 'happiness', places each in its historical context, and concludes that a number of important common types of justificatory argument in which those expressions are put to use are irremediably flawed. His arguments are too brief to be anything like conclusive, but that does nothing to rob them of their interest.

Geuss further clarifies both what he is against and where he himself stands in the essay from which his book takes its title, 'Outside ethics', in which he contrasts the dominant contemporary view of the nature and tasks of philosophical ethics with the very different perspective that can be derived from a reading of thinkers as various as Hegel, Marx, Nietzsche, Adorno, and Heidegger. On the dominant contemporary view the critical question for philosophical ethics is 'What ought I to do?', in which the 'ought' is a peculiarly moral 'ought', and it is taken to be possible to give an authoritative answer to that question. But considerations that Hegel advanced in his criticism of Kantian ethics and those very different considerations that led Nietzsche to reject both Kantian and utilitarian ethics show that there is no answer to that question that is both authoritative and adequately determinate. Heidegger indeed gives us grounds for suspecting that those who ask and answer this question do not know what they are doing. What they take to be the given form of the moral life may be instead either an artifact of the "individualistic post-Christian society in which we live" or "a kind of transcendental Illusion" (p. 63). And so we need to take seriously a number of alternative ways of thinking about the practical life which the contemporary view excludes, including skepticism.

At this point -- roughly half way through the essays -- the reader may start wondering just how far Geuss takes us beyond Adorno. In some respects the answer is clear. He draws upon Nietzsche in ways that Adorno never did -- although Horkheimer was a selective admirer of Nietzsche -- he makes excellent use of Heidegger and of some of Foucault's insights, and he extends his critique to thinkers of the late twentieth century, including Habermas, whose relationship to the Frankfurt School has been quite other than his own. But in other respects the answer is less clear. Consider first the account of Adorno that emerges from the three splendid essays about him in the latter half of this book, 'Suffering and Knowledge in Adorno', 'Art and Criticism in Adorno's Aesthetics', and 'Adorno's Gaps', which together constitute as good an interpretation of and commentary on Adorno as we are likely to get.

Adorno was as one with other early members of the Frankfurt School in holding that the kind of social order which they inhabited not only frustrates the satisfaction of human needs and oppressively distorts human relationships, but also inculcates illusions about its own character, illusions that inform not only many of our everyday beliefs, but the standard academic disciplines. We therefore have to learn how to outwit the social order in order to understand it, and we can begin to do so by identifying the significance of a variety of at first sight insignificant phenomena, to which we find ourselves responding as participants in the form of life to which they belong. In thinking about those phenomena and about the dominant social order we proceed dialectically through a series of denials, so that we arrive at a negative understanding, one that enables us to understand the social order that we inhabit from a point of view that is not its own, so escaping from the established consensus and becoming able to identify the radical defects and failures of the social order. Adorno believed that the interpretive knowledge thus gained had enabled him to recognize that the social order in which he found himself was one so evil that it was impossible to live rightly in it. Indeed he argued that the notion of a perfected human life is incoherent. Thus he found himself inescapably condemned to inhabit a culture in which the demands of spirit could no longer be met, so that in his time -- and surely he would have said also in ours -- the individual consciousness is doomed to be an unhappy consciousness.

To Adorno my inclination is to respond by quoting Dr. Johnson's friend, Oliver Edwards, who said that he too had tried to be a philosopher, but "cheerfulness was always breaking in", perhaps a philistine, but also an appropriate response. What grounds then are there for cheerfulness in any social order such as our own about which some of Adorno's central claims still hold true? Those grounds derive surely from the continuing resistance to deprivations, frustrations, and evils that informs so many everyday lives in so many parts of the world, as well as much of the best thinking about those deprivations, frustrations, and evils, including Adorno's and Geuss's. To be good, to live rightly, and to think rightly, it may be said in reply to Adorno, is to be engaged in struggle and a perfected life is one perfected in key part in and through conflicts. What kinds of conflicts?

The relevant list includes on the one hand those engaged in by members of some rank and file trade union movements, of some tenants' associations, of the disability movement, of a variety of farming, fishing, and trading cooperatives, and by some feminist groups, and on the other by those who are at work within schools, hospitals, a variety of industrial and financial workplaces, laboratories, theaters, and universities in order to make of these, so far as possible, scenes of resistance to the dominant ideology and the dominant social order. Geuss speaks of "the need to see 'virtue' in a wider historical and political context" (p. 90) and notes that nowadays "there is an almost unsurveyable variety of groups that are potentially or actually in conflict with each other" (p. 19). But he nowhere connects these remarks and therefore never identifies those areas in our own social order within which the relationships between the virtues, friendship, and directedness towards the achievement of the human good have taken on a distinctively contemporary form. And neither did Adorno.

To say this is to do no more than to gesture towards arguments that would have to be developed in order to sustain this critique. And such arguments would be convincing only if they also did justice to the brilliance of Adorno's -- and of Geuss's -- insights. Geuss is at his most insightful and his most effective in his penultimate essay, on Thucydides, Nietzsche, and Bernard Williams. He begins by considering and endorsing Nietzsche's reasons for preferring Thucydides to Plato as a guide to the human condition and argues that those reasons undermine the whole Western philosophical tradition insofar as it is a series of footnotes to Plato. He not only draws upon Williams's insights, both in Shame and Necessity and in Truth and Truthfulness, but does so in a way that prepares the reader for his suggestion that Williams in those works was following very much the same path as Nietzsche, inviting us "to reflect on a possible historical path not taken, one from ancient shame, tragedy, and Thucydidean 'inquiry', rather than from Plato, Christianity, and guilt" (p. 231). The illuminating portrait of Williams that he sketches ends up by placing Williams, although Geuss himself does not say this, alongside those thinkers whom Geuss takes to speak to us from "outside ethics". And this seems right. Yet Williams after all reached this position from a starting-point within analytic philosophy and he remained throughout his life a deeply committed liberal. So that it is not quite clear just how he is to be placed within Geuss's philosophical landscape.

Geuss and Williams agree in arguing that certain concepts that have been central to Western philosophical and moral tradition now need to be historically contextualized and perhaps dismantled. And in this essay Geuss's focus is on Williams's treatment of responsibility in Shame and Necessity, his identification of the disparate elements that have gone into the making and use of that concept, and his conclusion that there is not and could not be just one concept of responsibility, but that different conceptions are appropriate to different circumstances. Yet it is here that further questions arise. Is there nonetheless something about human beings that makes some concept of responsibility indispensable? And perhaps some concept of virtue and some concept of happiness? If so, what is that something?

That Geuss, like Williams and like Adorno, always provokes us into further questioning is of course a virtue of his essays, not a fault. And that the questions thus provoked are exactly the right questions for us here and now to ask makes it a great and unusual virtue. Geuss has put us in his debt with these essays. They should be required reading for graduate students in -- and most of all for those who remain inside -- ethics.