(Over)Interpreting Wittgenstein

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Biletzki, Anat, (Over)Interpreting Wittgenstein, Kluwer, 2003, 248pp, $39.00 (pbk), ISBN 1402013272.

Reviewed by Arthur W. Collins, CUNY Graduate Center


Anat Biletzki presents an organized characterization of the enormous volume of Wittgenstein interpretation initiated by the appearance of Russell’s Introduction to the English translation of the Tractatus more than 80 years ago. Merely grasping this vast subject matter is a big achievement and this schematization is useful and admirable. Biletzki is always intelligent, clear and interesting. For the most part, she does not try to distinguish good interpretations from bad ones, although this neutrality is understandably compromised even in the title in so far as it begins with the parenthetical word “over” which, I take it, indicates her decision to report on interpretations which are unsatisfactory. This is borne out in the text by passages that call some interpretations “reasonable” and do not try to avoid the judgment that other interpretations are conspicuously ill-advised. Obviously it would be unmanageable, and perhaps it would not be possible at all, to present such a wide-ranging survey along with full evaluative discussions of all of the interpretive proposals described.

The concept of “an interpretation” is not self-explanatory and it is used here with a degree of flexibility that strains what is ordinarily counted as an interpretation of the work of a philosopher. Following a railroad metaphor, types of interpretation are called “stations” of which the first five are labeled “standard” interpretations. These roughly follow one another in temporal order. Then there are two further parts of the book dealing with rather miscellaneous topics. It is not clear that the chapters beyond Six are devoted to distinguishable interpretations of Wittgenstein’s philosophy in the same sense as the standard interpretations. Problems on this score really set in at the fifth station, the “ethical,” which we might expect to be aimed at interpretations that are essentially ethical. Biletzki herself draws attention to a shift in that we are not really considering commentary that belongs to a new station of interpretation but merely ideas that “inhabit the early stations while focusing on Wittgenstein’s words on ethics.” Similar thoughts qualify the chapter on mathematical interpretation, and others. Biletzki remarks that Juliet Floyd thinks of a mathematical interpretation as something apt for “Wittgenstein’s philosophy in general” because “mathematical issues act as icons representing philosophical issues.” Properly speaking, it is only because of the potential aptness of considerations like Floyd’s that one can speak of something as a “mathematical interpretation” of a philosopher’s work. For instance, Leibniz’s thinking about the unfolding states of a monad was at least partly based on the taking of values of a function for an infinite sequence of arguments. To point this out is to point to a mathematical interpretation of Leibniz’s metaphysical ideas. Mere discussion of some of Leibniz’s many texts concerning mathematics does not justify speaking of a mathematical interpretation. Since Biletzki is clearly aware of this, it may be that she has decided that this rather big issue can be ignored without doing much harm. Even if that is an excuse, it is not right to count interpretation of someone’s thoughts about mathematics or ethics as a mathematical or ethical interpretation of anything.

Biletzki also introduces an important contrast between the interpretation of Wittgenstein’s thought by another philosopher and the use of his thought to further the projects of the interpreter. This tension between use and explication is nowhere more conspicuous than in the alleged anti-metaphysical “interpretation” ascribed to the Tractatus in the thinking of the positivists. The members of the Vienna Circle themselves aspired to discard metaphysics as without cognitive significance and for this purpose they created concepts like “emotive significance” to label the failed products of metaphysicians. They tried to find the same theme in Wittgenstein’s understanding of traditional philosophy. But, in the long run, the confused thinking that engenders philosophical theorizing according to Wittgenstein does not include the matters that cannot be “said” and can be “shown.” And these matters are certainly not the same as the things to which the positivists offer a condescending assignment to the domain of the emotive. Wittgenstein’s thinking is not compatible with the aspirations of positivism, and the character of his meetings with the Vienna Circle, as, for example, described in a memoir by Carnap, is hard to explain. Why was the attitude toward Wittgenstein so very respectful and virtually reverential, as Carnap complains, given that that there was so little in common. Similarly Wittgenstein’s willingness to meet repeatedly with the members of the Circle who appreciated so very little of his thinking is mysterious. Quite understandably, the issues ignored altogether by Russell, Ramsey and the members of Vienna Circle, begin to show up promptly at the second station of interpretation according to Biletzki’s schematization. The defining character here is the appreciation of the irreducible metaphysical contours of the Tractatus and thereby the meager scope of Wittgenstein’s wide-ranging thinking of which the positivists could make any legitimate use. Carnap said

… The most important insight I gained from this work was the conception that the truth of logical statements is based only on their logical structure and on the meaning of the terms. Logical statements are true under all conceivable circumstances; thus their truth is independent of the contingent facts of the world. On the other hand, it follows that these statements do not say anything about the world and thus have no factual content. (Quoted by Biletzki, p.44)

This is entirely defensible but it does not align Wittgenstein with the positivistic hostility to metaphysics. As Biletzki puts the point, it is probably better to suppose “that metaphysical statements are ineffable rather than non-existent” (46).

Biletzki says that the positivists’ use of Wittgenstein as anti-metaphysical and as embodying the gist of verificationism is an erudite and responsible interpretation. For the reasons given above, I don’t think this is easy to accept. If it were, it would have to make more sense to identify the things that fail to have a sense consisting of an arrangement of objects corresponding to an arrangement of words with the items the positivists wanted to classify as poetry.

At the end of (Over)Interpreting Wittgenstein (p.198) Biletzki suggests that it may be a good idea, and . fortiori, it may be possible, to take one’s Wittgenstein as is, that is, without any interpretation at all.

Perhaps to stay faithful to Wittgenstein we must resist interpreting him. Perhaps this means that Wittgenstein, especially the later Wittgenstein, if taken seriously, is to be read, savored and left alone. Perhaps understanding Wittgenstein consists in doing philosophy in the way he prescribed, that is to say, doing nothing traditionally philosophical. Interpretation itself, when looked at as a philosophical doing, harbors the very dangers of all traditional philosophy, that is to say the danger of misunderstanding. Perhaps all we ever needed to do, in looking for a moral to the story was to heed Wittgenstein himself:

It can be seen that there is a misunderstanding here from the mere fact that in the course of our argument we give one interpretation after another, as if each one contented us at least for a moment, until we thought of yet another standing behind it. (PI 201)

This amounts to the suggestion that all interpretation may be over-interpretation. The book that precedes this remark contemplates the staggering mass of writings that have tried to understand Wittgenstein. Interpreting, as far as I can see, is nothing but trying to understand. Indeed, such an effort inevitably risks misunderstanding. But what can it mean to suggest that we might forego interpretation altogether? Isn’t this just a way of saying we can refuse to try to understand him? Can a serious reader leave Wittgenstein’s thought savored but uninterpreted?

The very idea that interpretation is merely an option we might forego altogether seems to be established by Biletzki’s reminder that interpreting a philosopher’s thought is one of the traditional enterprises that constitutes philosophical work, and Wittgenstein himself encourages us to deal with the impulse to engage in philosophical work in ways other than by gratifying it. But we philosophers, and Biletzki among us, all know that this encouragement is itself something hard to understand, something that itself partakes of paradox. To the extent that that is so we are not in a position to decide to simply comply with Wittgenstein’s advice and avoid philosophizing altogether. “Savoring” his writings” is one of the things we would have to give up if we just abandon philosophical activity, as Wittgenstein advised some of his students to do. Though any interpretation risks misunderstanding him, by the same token, understanding him at all also requires that we run that risk.

This last consideration brings us to another among the “standard interpretations.” This embraces efforts to “take seriously” Wittgenstein’s statement at the end of the Tractatus (6.54) saying that a reader who understands him recognizes that the propositions of the Tractatus are nonsensical. This conception is related to the thought that we might not interpret Wittgenstein at all. For nonsensical propositions don’t offer anything that can bear interpretation. If certain propositions are nonsensical, commentary pointing that out should not be counted as an interpretation of those propositions. To utter nonsense is not to try and then succeed in putting something into words, namely, some nonsense. Nonsense cannot be interpreted just because it doesn’t mean anything. But propositions, or, better, sentences, that don’t mean anything, do not afford much of an opportunity for savoring without interpretation either. We can be sure that Wittgenstein does not mean by 6.54: Those who understand what I mean in these propositions recognize that I mean nothing for they are nonsensical propositions.

I assume that Biletzki counts this station among “standard interpretations” although, on the surface of it, it is exotic and paradoxical, because it is also quite prominent and has influential and skilled developers and adherents. This is the stance that tries to unpack the metaphor of “throwing away the ladder after having climbed up on it.” We are encouraged to face 6.54 and we are not to dilute its message. We are not permitted to “chicken out” as Cora Diamond says we will if we weaken the uncompromising word “nonsensical” and slip in appeal to some special or a rare kind of meaning. The obvious trouble here is that construing “nonsense” strictly, for instance, as gibberish, or as formulas that don’t make any assertions at all, seems incoherent on the surface. What shall we say went on at the stage when we first climbed up on this ladder of propositions? How did that climb help us at all if they are just nonsense? Wittgenstein says in this passage that he will explain how his propositions serve as elucidations. Gibberish cannot elucidate. Though no one wants to chicken out, avoiding that seems to be more than just difficult.

The advocates of strictness themselves find reasons for their thesis in propositions of the Tractatus. Where else cold one possibly find such reasons? But this is nothing but a form of chickening out. We naturally ask what Anat Biletzki makes of this station herself. This reader gets the impression that she has trouble taking “taking nonsense seriously” seriously. While she does not count them among the reasonable interpreters of Wittgenstein, Biletzki does not say (and I do not say either) that these interpreters do not produce interesting thoughts about Wittgenstein.

We should bear in mind a point emphasized by these interpreters themselves. 6.54 says “My propositions serve as elucidations in the following way: anyone who understands me eventually recognizes them as nonsensical.” This sentiment cannot be self-erasing in the very interpretation that they inspire. Wittgenstein is saying that his propositions do serve as elucidations in some way or other, even though they lead to ladder throwing by those who understand Wittgenstein. For we must ask, “Understand him in what regard?” There is no choice here but to understand him in so far as he is the author of these propositions. But, how could acquaintance with some gibberish raise certain readers to membership in the exclusive group of those who “understand me”, as Wittgenstein puts it? Nothing follows from nonsense. Plainly “climbing up” on rungs of nonsense does not afford a better view of something. This leaves the question: What is a better way of looking at Tractatus 6.54? The passage is itself a call for chickening out. 6.54 assures us that the propositions of the Tractatus do somehow serve as elucidations even though we are not to assent to them. Nor are they just false assertions that Wittgenstein confesses he has endorsed.

Wittgenstein is trying to say something that is he finds very hard to say. Just this much is a kind of guidance for us. The trouble with taking “nonsense” literally is that it does not yield a sentiment that is difficult and elusive at all. For instance, “These sentences are gibberish,” does not express something subtle and hard to express. If Wittgenstein meant something like, “The sentences of the Tractatus are gibberish,” that could be meant and said without any threatening paradox. (Of course, if this were one of the sentences of the Tractatus, a hopeless paradox would result.) But if we could segregate and comment on the sentences of the Tractatus, the assertion would not be troubling. In other words, the so-called “new Wittgensteinians” are surely right to say that we have to take the passage seriously. But taking the passage seriously cannot be done if we take “nonsense” literally. We could at best have a context like the following: We might find the words of an ancient Greek song and scholars might expend great efforts in reading the archaic script and devising a translation of the lines only to find that the song was merely an arrangement of nonsense syllables to which those who sang the song all those centuries ago ascribed no meaning. This is not a difficult idea. There is nothing tricky or paradoxical here. Certain linguistic products were taken to be meaningful sentences when they were no such thing, they were just gibberish. This shows that we cannot interpret Wittgenstein in 6.54 without chickening out. Since that is established, “chickening out” is not the right expression here at all either.

One final thought on this point. Wittgenstein says that some things he asserted in the Tractatus are not correct. Biletzki considers such thoughts in the stations two and three. The assertions in question are philosophical and the “correction” is something like recognizing one’s earlier confusion. A view that springs from confusion is not necessarily a view that needs to be replaced. Even a simple denial of the assertion may embody the same confusion as the assertion itself. One of the motifs common in the later development of Wittgenstein’s thinking is his exposure of illusions that amount to the conviction that we need a philosophical theory in order to explain something. When in the grip of such an illusion we mean our propositions to fill a need that doesn’t exist. So we intend to mean something where there really isn’t anything there to be meant. For my own interests, the great example of this is the philosophical temptation to characterize putative inner mental realities like beliefs, rememberings, expectations, and intentions. At Philosophical Investigations §308 Wittgenstein uses “the conjuring trick” as a metaphor for this philosophical illusion. In the grip of the conjuring trick we are utterly convinced that something went on in our minds just now when we said, “I just now remembered.” If we are scientifically minded we are likely to suppose that it was something that went on in our brain. Although our words suggest a picture of an event we noticed taking place in us, Wittgenstein does not think we confront anything like a phenomenon and, therefore, we are not really in the position of asking, What are these things or occurrences? Are they spiritual, or mental? Or are they physical and bodily realities? Thus he does not think that one answer here is correct and others are errors. We are not successfully asking about anything in his understanding of these things. I think Wittgenstein is right about this and that this is one of his greatest insights as a philosopher. But for this context, I am interested in his view, and whether we accept it or not is not relevant to our present concern. Wittgenstein’s grasp of the philosophical is aided by the fact that he was himself subject to the illusion of the need for an identification of inner realities. While convinced of the need for a theory, Wittgenstein might have tried to put into words the real constitution of remembering, and then later he may have come to think that he was mistaken, not about the real constitution of remembering, but about whether there is something here that has a constitution. In other words, he ceases to think that the question that expresses our felt need is an intelligible question.

In such a context we could say that Wittgenstein thought he meant something by his sentences but they only express confusions. Of course, we cannot say, “he really meant them as nonsensical.” That cannot be what those who understand me come to understand. But he was mistaken all right. In a rather natural sense, we could say that he thought his propositions were meaningful but they were not. Since his sentences were engendered by unappreciated confusions of their author, they actually meant nothing. They were nonsense. But again, without any sense of strain or boggling paradox, it remains the case that Wittgenstein did mean by his assertions what he thought he meant by them. Indeed, there is clearly a sense in which the statement, “In saying p, X thought he meant such and such but X was wrong and really didn’t mean anything at all,” is itself conceptually improper. What someone means by their words is a question of how they intend what they say and there is no room for mistakes here. Let us look again for guidance at a comparison with philosophical nonsense that comes out of confusion and gibberish. Gibberish is not all alike. Thus, some gibberish sentences rhyme, and some do not rhyme. But when it comes to meaning, one bit of gibberish is interchangeable with another. Two bits always have the same meaning, namely, none. But a gibberish sentence does not express what Wittgenstein meant by his sentence which, since it was generated by his confusion, turned out to be nonsensical. We surmise that, before his enlightenment on this point, he took a reference to someone’s remembering something to be a reference to an event of some kind. Wittgenstein thought his words were doing a certain kind of job that words sometimes do. His assertion was meant to express the real nature of remembering. It remains the case that that is what he meant. Now he realizes that he was wrong, and he was not wrong about the nature of remembering but confused in the assumption that remembering must have some nature or other.

Now I cannot say at all that this case is one that Wittgenstein might have had in mind in 6.54. I think it was not. My example belongs to a later stage when his grasp of the shortcomings of the Tractatus was much more developed and stable. It is, I hope, a useful example nonetheless just because it brings to our attention how a person can say, “My sentences in that book are nonsensical,” without forcing his readers to choose between a spineless chickening-out and a seemingly tough-minded understanding which is conspicuously unsatisfactory except in point of courage.