Overcoming Cynicism: William James and the Metaphysics of Engagement

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Megan Mustain, Overcoming Cynicism: William James and the Metaphysics of Engagement, Continuum, 2011, 186pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441115225.

Reviewed by Russell DiSilvestro, California State University-Sacramento


Quick: what do biologist Richard Dawkins and pastor Jerry Falwell have in common with industrialist Andrew Carnegie and philosopher Diogenes of Sinope (whom Aristotle dubbed "Diogenes the Dog")? Answer: each is a cynic whose cynicism can be overcome by applying a few metaphysical insights from William James. Or so Megan Mustain argues in this short but ambitious book.

Her main argument has four parts, and her chapters neatly reflect this (Ch. 5 is summary and application). Historical forms of cynicism -- represented in classical Greece by Diogenes, and in Victorian America by Carnegie and others -- manage, despite their differences, to share a common temperament and to produce a similar cluster of bad consequences (Ch. 1). Much the same can be said for contemporary forms of cynicism that appear at first blush to be opposites -- Christian "fundamentalism" and atheistic "scientism" (Ch. 2). What unites these cynicisms is their metaphysical stances, since each denies the reality and significance of at least one of the "felt relations" James affirmed when cashing out his radical empiricism -- namely, the felt relations of "conjunction" and "disjunction" (Ch. 3). The remedy for cynicism thus involves attending more carefully to these relations, both in metaphysics proper and in concrete areas of human life such as loneliness, death, love, and gender (Ch. 4). This remedy helps us resist the errors and avoid the bad consequences of cynicism, and navigate toward more "engaged" religious and scientific pedagogies (Ch. 5).

I agree with the overall arc of Mustain's project. There does seem to be a perennial human need to overcome cynicism, and you do not have to be a philosopher to suspect that cynicism is currently cresting. The philosophical questions, then, are how to understand the nature of cynicism and respond to it.

Mustain consistently notes that cynicism is "an active renunciation of ameliorative possibilities" (41), and once calls it "the condition of lost belief in worldly possibilities" (114). As these phrases suggest, cynicism is a feature of one's temperament, not merely a proposition one believes.

Looking at historical representatives of cynicism, Mustain sketches Diogenes in familiar strokes, emphasizing how his cynicism was based on a rejection of all manner of human customs and their relevance for living a truly human life. She paints him as a sort of 'Nature Not Culture' cynic, in sharp contrast with (American) Victorians. The latter, in Mustain's telling, represent a sort of 'Culture Not Nature' cynic (81), at least as long as 'Culture' means 'Our Culture':

the cynicism of the Victorians lay in their rendering of . . . hope. Their belief in progress entailed the belief that (white, bourgeois) society was the only hope of humankind . . . The Victorians, armed with a sense of entitlement, were cynical with regard to those things not included in their cultural trajectory, dismissing them on the grounds that they were merely natural or merely savage, and therefore amoral, uncivilized, and contrary to the thrust of history (27).

As to contemporary cynicism: it's "a complex, many-faceted phenomenon" (42) that can pervade our political, interpersonal, and private lives. These features "make it a rather difficult phenomenon to pin down," so Mustain concentrates on fundamentalism and scientism because they are culturally powerful and visible. "In focusing upon these hard-liners, I offer a sketch of the extremes of contemporary cynicism in hopes of shedding light upon the tangled cynical middle ground in which most of us find ourselves" (43).

What is "fundamentalism"? Alvin Plantinga wrote that "fundamentalist" in the academy often means "stupid S.O.B. whose theological opinions are considerably to the right of mine."[1]Fortunately, that is not Mustain's meaning. She wants to use the term "fundamentalist" more or less synonymously with "evangelical," "conservative Protestant," and "born-again," though she thinks each phrase "terribly inadequate in its own way" (44 fn 3). She explicitly borrows the framework of Baptist researcher Nancy T. Ammerman by focusing on four central features: evangelism (actively sharing the gospel with the lost in hopes they can become saved), separatism (stressing the importance of separating oneself from the world in various ways), Biblical inerrancy (holding that the scriptures in the canon are without error), and premillenialism (maintaining Jesus will make a bodily return before starting a thousand-year earthly kingdom) (44).

Fundamentalism is cynical, Mustain argues, for reasons that emerge directly from Ammerman's categories. For example, evangelism is supposed to be inherently cynical because "the radical nature of the divide between the lost and the saved represents a deep-seated cynicism regarding human possibilities" (49); "Like the Victorians, fundamentalists of Falwell's ilk are cynical in that they see humanity in its 'natural' form as barbaric and hopeless" (50). Separatism allegedly makes even democratic participation suspect: "the unsaved masses are not legitimate voices in any conversation, as their views and proposals are the works of Satan. This cynical view of one's interlocutors precludes the sort of genuine democratic communication that Dewey so passionately articulates" (52). And premillenialism apparently undercuts social transformation now: "The fundamental cynicism of the apocalyptic temperament lies with its disbelief in the possibility of contextual, worldly amelioration and the continued creation and recreation of meaning at the hands of individuals and communities" (58).

What is "scientism"? Mustain uses a three-part definition from Larry Hickman:

[1] the view that the methods of the natural sciences are paradigmatic for all other areas of experience, [2] the view that the conclusions of the natural sciences are universally applicable to all other areas of experience, and [3] the view that the natural sciences are objective or "value free" (61).[2]

Scientism is cynical for each of these reasons, she argues. For example, its methodological reductionism "contributes to a cynical view of experience which renders much of human activity useless or, at best, dispensable" (67), as this quote from Francis Crick suggests: "'You,' your joys and your sorrows, your memories and your ambitions, your sense of personal identity and free will are in fact no more than the behavior of a vast assembly of nerve cells and their associated molecules."[3]

Just as she did for the historical cynicisms, Mustain highlights the negative consequences of each of these contemporary cynicisms for both individuals and groups. Indeed, she argues that the contemporary forms "demonstrate striking similarities to the cynicisms of Diogenes and the Victorians, respectively" (78). Contemporary scientism, she argues, is "Neo-Diogean" (81); contemporary fundamentalism, "Neo-Victorian" (81).

In her third and most difficult chapter, Mustain argues that cynicism is the predictable result of "non-relational" philosophies and the sense of "disconnectedness" they entail (86). First, she summarizes how James classifies the felt relations we experience into "conjunctive" and "disjunctive" relations:

Within a given field, relations are conjunctive -- the continuity of personal history, the stream of thought, the experiences of near-ness, in-ness, for-ness, and same-ness. But one field, for example, my field, or point of view, is "ejective" to another, for example, your field. We both experience their relation as a disjunction (95).

Mustain illustrates how denying such relations leads to cynicism by using an example -- the question "Is life worth living?" -- and two philosophies current in James' day -- "materialistic empiricism" and "monistic rationalism."

Consider how materialistic empiricism's denial of conjunctive relations leads to cynicism. Are mosquito lives worth living? A description of them suggests not. But are human lives really that different? Empiricism suggests a negative or agnostic answer for several reasons, one of which is this:

insofar as both the mosquito and I are made up of matter in motion, our experiences are but so many separate nervous-system-states. Accordingly, all of our feelings and thoughts (if we have them) are nothing but isolated perceptions made (somehow) mental; we simply have a feeling or a thought that corresponds (again, somehow) to a particular collision of molecular billiard balls. Our lives are abstractions, on this view. For what is, is a succession of isolated perceptions, and their connections and relations are supplied by the mind. As such, it does not really make sense to ask of the worth of my life (or the poor mosquito's), for the absence of real relations between things and events renders "me-ness," "I-ness, and "my-ness" mere figments of an overactive imagination (101).

From this and other considerations Mustain concludes "the failure to deal with experiences of continuity . . . lands us squarely in a worldview that is deeply cynical about our own lives and the lives of others" (102).

Mustain next argues that both Diogenes and the fundamentalists fail to adequately deal with "disjunctions" of several sorts while both Victorianism and scientism fail to deal with various "conjunctions" (105-13). She ends the chapter by showing how each form of cynicism tends to reinforce the very sorts of "disconnection" that produced its distinctive form of cynicism to begin with (113-7).

Chapter 4 is the most interesting of the book. The structure of the argument has not changed -- Mustain claims fundamentalism and scientism each "cynically exclude the experience of such relations [as joy, sorrow, hope, despair, and friendship] from their accounts of what it means to life a human life" (119).  But there is a new tone to the discussion: "I focus upon thelived experience of relations of disjunction and conjunction. That is, I seek to describe what it feels like to be disconnected or connected from things, institutions, and people" (119).

What comes next is a brief but beautiful description of loneliness and death, followed by an attempt to show how such experiences of disjunction are unsuccessfully dealt with by fundamentalism and scientism. Then there is a short but thoughtful discussion of the conjunctive possibilities and pitfalls of love and gender followed by a story about how scientism and fundamentalism fail to adequately integrate these realities. Finally, Mustain offers her own approach "that neither dismisses nor reifies either form of relatedness" (137). This approach begins "with the experiences as they are experienced to be" rather than with an uncritical cluster of what James called "over-beliefs" that tend "to lead us to overemphasize those aspects of our experience that fit neatly into our system and dismiss those aspects that conflict" (138). It is here, especially, that the "metaphysics of engagement" (from the subtitle) comes to the fore:

By promoting an active grappling with the concrete problems of experience, our philosophy seeks not merely to describe the world in which we live; it seeks also to remodel the world. In so doing, we emphasize the efficaciousness of human experience, the real possibilities for concrete reconstruction and growth, and the vital importance of engaging the world's possibilities . . . In short, we cannot be cynical if we are to undertake such a vital and fateful engagement; for when we are cynical, we actively denounce and destroy the very possibilities that offer amelioration of our concrete problems (145).

Since Chapter 5 summarizes the book and takes a glance at the future of teaching in religion and science, I will pass over it and conclude with two thoughts on the book as a whole.

First, one of the strongest features of the book is its organization. Regardless of how persuasive one finds each tree, the shape and structure of the forest is hard to miss. Mustain's main argument is elegantly explained before (5-6), during (41, 83, 117, 145), and after (146-7) its growth through each chapter. And while slender and succinct (at 163 pages of text), the book packs a scholarly punch: footnotes are on almost every page, and a 13-page index and 11-page bibliography make it easy to go back in and go beyond.

Second, I applaud Mustain's effort to bring together such a diverse array of authors, time periods, and sources for philosophical analysis and synthesis. It's not every day that one finds a philosopher who took the time to (for example) find some common Jamesian thread linking Pat Robertson and Merleau-Ponty on the topic of how to deal with the risks and disappointments of daily living. And yet, there are times when this effort to make a fit looks a bit like fitting a square peg into a round hole. Sometimes this is due to the argument moving too quickly through a linked chain of ideas as follows: author A in writing W represents idea I, which exemplifies school S, which has a type of badness T, which is a kind of cynicism K, which comes from improper handling of relation R and as a result has pernicious consequences C. Of course, it never happens that quickly, but you get the point: this is a complex chain, and though most of it works fairly well for Diogenes, I found it more precarious at points for Victorianism, scientism, and fundamentalism.

Take just one example: the link between and K. Mustain occasionally admits that the main characters in her story of cynicism are actually rather hopeful about quite a few things in life, but she classifies them as cynics anyway because their hopefulness is not inclusive enough. The Victorians she focuses on "did not identify themselves as cynical" (20), and yet "in their reflections upon their age, one finds a deep cynicism fomenting . . . The Victorians' optimism with respect to the possibilities of Western culture conceals a deep cynicism with respect to alternate notions of value and social organization" (21-2). Likewise regarding scientism: "methodological scientism underwrites a profound cynicism with respect to the ameliorative possibilities of non-scientific inquiry" (62). These observations about the limits of hopefulness may be fair enough, but what Mustain needs here (and elsewhere) is a more explicit and emphatic recognition that cynicism about this or that does not a cynical tendency or a cynical person make.

This point can be put another way. Imagine a time machine allows Falwell, Dawkins, and Carnegie to visit Diogenes. Carnegie: "Don't despair Diogenes; there's hope for you in culture." Dawkins: "Don't despair Diogenes; there's hope for you in science." Falwell: "Don't despair Diogenes; there's hope for you in Jesus." (Diogenes scoffs at them all.) I admit there is one cynic here. But on Mustain's accounting there are four. Could it be more accurate to note people's cynicism about some things and belief in the possibility of ameliorationabout other things, without classifying them as cynics? Why see the glass as half empty rather than half full?

Let me take a bit of my own advice: while I remain doubtful about a few of Mustain's claims in this book, I see her project as a glass half full -- indeed, far more than half full. She has given us a book that is truly engaging (in her technical sense), a book that will help overcome the cynicism of anyone who reads it.

[1] Alvin Plantinga, Warranted Christian Belief (Oxford University Press, 2000), p. 245.

[2] Larry A. Hickman, Philosophical Tools for Technological Culture: Putting Pragmatism to Work, The Indiana Series to the Philosophy of Technology, ed. Don Ibde (Bloomington, IN and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2001), 74.

[3] Francis Crick, The Astonishing Hypothesis: The Scientific Search for the Soul (New York: Charles Scribner's Sons, 1994), 3; quoted by Mustain, 48.